Interpretation of Nietzsche's Second Untimely Meditation

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Martin Heidegger, Interpretation of Nietzsche's Second Untimely Meditation, Ullrich Haase and Mark Sinclair (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2016, 312pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253022660.

Reviewed by Tracy Colony, Bard College Berlin


In the winter semester of 1938-39, Heidegger offered a weekly seminar on Nietzsche's second Untimely Meditation, On the Advantages and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874). Although originally planned as a seminar, the large number of students made it necessary to alter this format into one more resembling a lecture course. The material for this volume consists of Heidegger's notes for this course, seminar reports by students and a more extensive summary made by Heidegger's son Hermann who was also in attendance. This text first appeared in German in 2003 as volume 46 of the Gesamtausgabe or "Complete Edition" of Heidegger's work. Although Heidegger did not choose to include any substantive material from this course in his seminal two-volume Nietzsche, the fact that he decided to place these notes in Division II of the Gesamtausgabe, which contains lecture courses, and not Division IV, which includes seminars, can be seen to indicate the importance which Heidegger accorded this course. While announced as an interpretation of Nietzsche's early essay, this course opens upon much wider questions within Heidegger's confrontation with Nietzsche in terms of memory, time, animality and the ultimate role of "life" in Nietzsche's thought. Accordingly, this new translation will shed light on both Heidegger's complex relation to Nietzsche and the way in which Heidegger understood the final unfolding epoch of metaphysics.

Heidegger's notes for this course consist of 138 individually titled parts collected into 20 lettered sections. As is clear from the seminar reports, only the first 98 parts were presented in the course. The remaining ones, however, continue to develop the central thematic of life in Nietzsche's thought. The presented sections correspond to Heidegger's close reading of the first 6 sections of On the Advantages and Disadvantages of History for Life. There is no mention of the other 4 sections of Nietzsche's essay or the other Untimely Meditations. However, this particular focus is intentional in that Heidegger understood sections 5 and 6 of Nietzsche's essay to contain what was philosophically most essential. Although presented as a lecture course, these notes often appear cursory and schematic in comparison with Heidegger's notes for other lecture courses, which were often much more developed. Despite the challenges this material presents, the translators have done an excellent job in responding to the particular demands of this text and have produced a translation which is both philosophically felicitous and readable. Clearly informed by other translations in this series, their translation is persuasive, consistent, and includes the original German exactly when it is important and helpful. In particular, their translation of the words associated with the central theme of history, rendering Historie as historiology and Geschichte as history and historisch as historical and geschichtlich as historial is a very intuitive and convincing solution.

Heidegger introduces this course as: "a questioning dialogue with an essential thinker" (5) and also as an exercise in learning to think, read and question that he describes as: "a first instruction in mindfulness [Besinnung]." (6) The guiding question for Heidegger's reading of Nietzsche's second Untimely Meditation is presented as an inquiry into the relation between historiology and life. In the first 8 sections, devoted to the initial 4 sections of Nietzsche's text, Heidegger focuses on the absolute primacy Nietzsche accorded the unhistorical in relation to the historical as such. For Nietzsche, the historical is rooted in the earlier unhistorical character of animality and the plastic power of life. For this reason, at the opening of his essay Nietzsche employs the image of an animal who "constantly forgets" (14) to illustrate the more original unhistorical source of the human capacity for history within life itself. For Heidegger, this priority of the unhistorical is ambiguous and structured by the implicit metaphysical understanding of animality as the more original generic realm within which all human phenomena are determined. Heidegger charges that Nietzsche's projection of the unhistorical animal as the ground for historiology relies upon the conflation of animal attributes with the specifically human capacity for relating to history.

In contrast to Nietzsche's privileging of the unhistorical as "surging life not yet limited by historiology" (81) Heidegger charges that Nietzsche has failed to understand that "only that which is historical can be unhistorical." (24) Nietzsche's attempt to articulate the primacy of the unhistorical over the historical from the perspective of a more original capacity for forgetting and remembering only deepens the ambiguity of his account. For Heidegger, the characterization of the animal as constantly forgetting also relies upon an unjustified projection into the animal of an earlier capacity to retain memories as such. What this determination of the animal overlooks is that: "only where the possibility of re-taining (that is, of holding-before-oneself and re-presenting) exists in the first place can forgetting itself be possible." (31) On Heidegger's account, the animal is not unhistorical and constantly forgetting but radically without history and the capacity to either retain or forget. Nietzsche's unexamined presupposition that the animal can be thought in relation to history will also be the point of critique in Heidegger's reading of his account of the monumental, antiquarian and critical modes of historiology. For Heidegger, these different modes of thematizing and utilizing history in the service of life point to the deeper question of what criterion in life is the basis for these evaluations of the past. This question then structures the culmination of Heidegger's reading in which truth and justice are interpreted from the perspective of Nietzsche's concept of the living and the ultimate metaphysical contours of his thought are brought into relief.

In the final six sections of the presented notes, Heidegger focuses on sections 5 and 6 of Nietzsche's essay and poses the question of how, and according to what, does life evaluate itself. For Heidegger, the sense of "life" at the heart of Nietzsche's metaphysics is nothing simply biological but rather: "a living-beyond-itself, the disquiet of a constant outstripping of itself, . . . Life in itself judges, builds, destroys." (150) This proper vitality and movement of life beyond itself towards higher configurations is thematized in Heidegger's reading in terms of "justice." On Heidegger's account, Nietzsche still thinks within the traditional metaphysical opposition of being and becoming where the realm of being is understood as the domain of the constant and the conventional determinations of what is true. Nietzsche inverts this standard dichotomy in favor of the becoming character of life understood as an earlier necessity to destroy and transfigure the static domain of the true. Accordingly, the traditional ordering of truth and illusion is also inverted so that truth becomes a form of necessary illusion in the service of life's transition beyond itself. Heidegger understands the meaning of justice in Nietzsche's thought as this movement beyond the true towards higher figurations of life.

The ultimate or higher sense of justice that structures Heidegger's reading is nothing juridical or moral, but rather, is thought on a metaphysical level as the way in which life creatively overcomes itself: "Justice takes back truth (as the constant) into the becoming of life." (114) This conjugation of truth and life via justice expresses life's ownmost plastic vitality as the creative ability to posit new formations, goals, and horizons. When viewed as a function of life, this sense of justice is more original than the constancy of truth in that it "adjusts itself to life" (159) and is "compliant with life" (159) in respect to its innermost character as a movement beyond itself. For Heidegger, this metaphysical sense of justice as the creative transition beyond the fixed constancy of the true, already in this early essay, articulated an essential aspect of Nietzsche's philosophy: "The thought of a higher justice is the center from which Nietzsche's thinking radiates, a center that was still hidden from him at the time of the Untimely Meditations." (175) This transition to higher figurations of life at the basis of Nietzsche's early philosophy, and which would later be expressed as will to power, is also understood by Heidegger as a culminating expression of the foundational role of subjectivity in the modern period.

From Heidegger's perspective, Nietzsche's attempted decentering of subjectivity on the basis of its earlier rootedness in life itself does not overcome the subject but amounts to merely an inversion which remains complicit with the early modern concept of the subjectum. This recourse to the living merely "replaces the cogito by a vivo" (114) which in no way leads beyond the subjectum but instead brings modernity to its final exhaustive configuration. Rather than drawing into question the ultimacy of life as an ontological ground, Nietzsche reiterates the self-conservation of the subject which, despite its vital transcendence, is merely a "going beyond oneself in order to come all the more back to oneself and only to oneself." (179) Accordingly, the science of historiology in Nietzsche's early essay is shown to be a function of the transition of the living to higher configurations of its own capacities and power. Heidegger will interpret this as a precursor to the thought of will to power and finally as the most extreme forgottenness of being in technological ordering and machination. Heidegger concludes the lecture course by again stressing the central significance of the concept of life in Nietzsche's metaphysics and that despite this limitation Nietzsche's thought remains: "inaccessible for any exploitation by 'worldviews' and 'literary' enterprises, inviolable for any historical importunateness." (181) Heidegger then closes with a call for meditative readings of philosophy that are guided by a search for knowledge beyond the scope of mere science.

This new translation makes available for the first time Heidegger's engagement with a major work in philosophy. This text can also be seen to shed light on Heidegger's own complex and changing relation to Nietzsche in this period. Critical attention will at once be directed towards an interpretation and assessment of Heidegger's reading of Nietzsche's early essay. However, this translation also opens the possibility of comparing and tracing the relations between this material and that of other periods in Heidegger's long engagement with Nietzsche. Although Heidegger was most likely familiar with Nietzsche's essay from early on, its first explicit mention comes in the brief but positive treatment of its three modes of historiology in section 76 of Being and Time. It is now possible to compare this early interpretation of Nietzsche's essay with Heidegger's later historical perspective on this text. Examining the relation of this course to Heidegger's later Nietzsche courses will also bring to light many lines of influence. One example of this can be seen in Heidegger's focus on the concept of "justice" at the conclusion of his 1939 lecture course "The Will to Power as Knowledge." There was a passing mention in that course of Nietzsche's early essay as the basis for Heidegger's focus on justice. However, the centrality that Heidegger accorded this term in the later course can now be better understood in light of the directly preceding 1938-39 course.

One aspect of Heidegger's relation to Nietzsche that this new translation brings more clearly into view is the central role that Heidegger accorded themes surrounding the question of life as such. The concept of life in Nietzsche's metaphysics is a central focus in the as yet untranslated "Arbeitskreis" that Heidegger held during the summer semester of 1937. These exercises were devoted to an elaboration of his concurrent lecture course on Nietzsche's thought of eternal recurrence and are available in volume 87 of the Gesamtausgabe. Many of the themes developed there, such as embodiment, animality and the living, are continued and expanded upon in Heidegger's reading of the second Untimely Meditation in the following year. The importance of the question of "life" is further seen in Heidegger's extended references in the final sections of the 1938-39 course material to his own treatment of this theme in the 1929-30 lecture course "The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics." Heidegger's questioning dialogue with Nietzsche's second Untimely Meditation was the first course on Nietzsche that Heidegger offered after his seminal 1936-37 confrontation with Nietzsche. This new translation brings to light the way in which Heidegger again through Nietzsche articulated the unfolding dangers of the final epoch of metaphysics and Heidegger's own sense of the need for untimely meditations.