Interpretation: Ways of Thinking about the Sciences and the Arts

Placeholder book cover

Peter Machamer and Gereon Wolters (eds.), Interpretation: Ways of Thinking about the Sciences and the Arts, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2010, 266pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780822943921.

Reviewed by Amy M. Schmitter, University of Alberta


This wide-ranging collection of essays emerged from what must have been an enjoyably eclectic 2008 meeting of the Pittsburgh-Konstanz Colloquium in the Philosophy of Science, one charged with the double task of honoring Gereon Wolters and of showing off the many arenas where interpretation has a place. Peter Machamer sets the stage in an opening essay, in which he expresses his hope that the anthology will rectify the loss of interpretation as "a hot topic in contemporary philosophy" (p. 14). Machamer is surely right that interpretation occupies an odd place in contemporary philosophy: despite its cognitive significance, it garners little attention in epistemology. But it does constitute a central area of investigation for some stripes of philosophy of language, for hermeneutics, and for philosophy of art and literary criticism. If Machamer, Wolters and their contributors have their way, it should also figure importantly in various areas of the philosophy of science, philosophy of mind and action, and practical aesthetics.

The topics represented in the collection defy easy summary. Machamer's introductory "Some Cogitations on Interpretations" discusses goals, elements and domains of interpretation in comparison with other cognitive activities and products. Next comes Ruth Lorand's "The Logic of Interpretation," which argues for understanding interpretation as a problem-solving activity, illustrated by a particular problem of Biblical exegesis. The three articles that follow consider interpretations of several nineteenth- and twentieth-century German philosophers by important latter-day thinkers, and in so doing, advance distinctive proposals about the function and role of interpretation in art, in epistemology, and for self-understanding. In "Interpretation as Cultural Orientation," Annemarie Gethmann-Siefert addresses Hegel's aesthetics and its appropriation by Danto to argue that Hegel conceives of art as both interpreting and transforming cultural life-forms. Paolo Parrini's "Heremeneutics and Epistemology" sketches a "third way" in epistemology for conceiving a priori knowledge, truth and rationality (pp. 59-61); Parrini motivates his suggestions by examining how Heidegger misconstrues Kant's notion of truth as correspondence, proposing instead a view of truth as an empty, yet regulative ideal. Moving ahead a generation, Kristin Gjesdal's "Davidson and Gadamer on Plato's Dialectical Ethics" critiques Donald Davidson's interpretation of Hans-Georg Gadamer's approach to Platonic dialectic; she defends the richness of Gadamer's understanding of the interpretive self-understanding of Dasein, while lamenting the missed opportunity for Anglophone philosophy of language to engage philosophical hermeneutics.

The next group of essays constitutes a kind of interpretive test case. Nicholas Rescher offers a brief on "The Interpretation of Philosophical Texts," covering the aims and methodological constraints of exegetical interpretation; it is followed by response pieces from Catherine Wilson ("The Explanation of Consciousness and the Interpretation of Philosophical Texts") and Andreas Blank ("On Interpreting Leibniz's Mill"). Wilson and Blank use the difficulties of the famously obstinate "mill argument" passage from Leibniz's New Essays on Human Understanding to probe the suitability of Rescher's principles: do they illuminate how best to understand Leibniz's case against reducing the explanation of perception to the structure and motions of machines? Wilson and Blank find them largely successful.

The remaining essays fall into several groups. Christoph Lumer's "How to Interpret Human Actions (Including Moral Actions)" examines how we interpret human actions, comprising speech acts and deeds of all sorts. This is followed by two pieces on interpretation in medicine: Kenneth Schaffner's "Interpretive Practices in Medicine" considers several targets of medical interpretation, focusing on diagnosis, while Cornelius Borck's "Interpreting Medicine" comprehensively surveys diagnosis in medicine and offers an interpretation of the nature and aims of various medical traditions themselves. With "Concept Formation via Hebbian Learning," Paul Churchland turns the conversation towards the basic cognitive skills involved in learning and perceptual recognition by analyzing Hebbian mechanisms for generating differentially complex maps of spatio-temporal processes and objects. George Gale's "Interpreting Novel Objects" then considers some further kinds of perceptual interpretation, which he dubs "perceiving as," using the distinctive case of appreciating and classifying such hybrid wines as Baco Noir. The collection ends on a practical, even reformist note with Ulrich Sautter's detailed, experimentally based proposals for "Classifying Dry German Riesling Wines," meant as a nuanced replacement for the blunt general scores popularized by Robert Parker. The conference participants seem to have put some of Gale's and Sautter's claims to the test in a bit of wine-tasting themselves -- a model for hands-on conference participation we can hope future conferences will emulate.

As this somewhat hurried summary should show, the sheer breadth of the anthology forces us to consider how we should understand the nature and scope of interpretation. Machamer maintains that interpretations hold cognitive content, and that they seek to make some object intelligible. For this reason, he suggests that interpretations get a grip on objects that are not already thoroughly intelligible (although not completely unintelligible either), a view also found in Lorand and Rescher. Differences in the domains of target-objects and the sorts of purposes they serve, he suggests, provide a natural schema for classifying interpretations. On the basis of such considerations, Machamer suggests dividing the activity of interpretation into several, not necessarily distinct, components. Some of these components should be fairly uncontroversial: the activity of interpretation involves an object, an interpreter, and a purpose. Others are more so, such as the claim that interpretation requires a method or procedure. But Machamer is careful to allow for broad conceptions of his proposals: he does not restrict interpretation to linguistic objects or activities, nor does he require that it take place consciously, and he is liberal about the ontology of its "objects."

So generous a view seems warranted by the scope of the essays. But it also comes at a cost: even sympathetic readers may wonder whether the phenomena falling under the rubric of "interpretation" here form a coherent set. Although Machamer insists that a good account "must show the similarities (and differences) among interpreting and explaining in natural science, human science, and the arts" (p. 9), we don't get much sense of what analogies or family resemblances link the various activities and products considered in the collection. Perhaps, though, we should simply look to the proposals advanced in the subsequent essays. However, some topics one might expect receive scant coverage: several essays mention Gadamer, but only Gjesdal covers his work in detail. Her piece is also the only one to treat Davidson. No essays discuss the most common concerns of interpretation for literary or artworks (despite some attention to cognate issues in textual exegesis). So, we are left to our own devices for deciding whether various proposals apply to seemingly standard candidates for interpretation: our everyday understanding of malapropisms, the incorporation of statutes and precedents in Constitutional law, scholarly glosses of Paradise Lost, or the revisioning of the Hollywood western by Kurosawa's Yojimbo, and of Yojimbo by Sergio Leone.

Several authors in the first set of essays start by rejecting the familiar contrast between interpretation and explanation, taken as the special provinces of the humanities and sciences respectively. Presumably, one source for the suspect contrast is the common position in philosophy of science that holds explanation to be the aim of theory and understands explanation through the deductive-nomological model or its rivals. This seems to be what Lorand has in mind when she compares the broad-problem solving activities of interpretation to the "verbal manifestation of order" that is explanation (p. 19). Parrini certainly does in explaining why the dichotomy appears implausible in the wake of post-positivist developments in epistemology (p. 44). But explanation itself remains an unsettled concept; the models in philosophy of science do not exhaust even theoretical explanation. As Paolo Mancosu has shown, logic and epistemics since Aristotle (at least) often distinguished between mere demonstration (that such-and-such is the case) and genuinely explanatory accounts that show why the demonstration holds; explanation may thus have a place in many disciplines, including such primarily non-verbal ones as mathematics.[1] For this reason, I do not find either the contrast with explanation -- or its rejection -- to be terribly helpful for imposing order on the concept of interpretation. Both are equally rich, and equally unwieldy, notions.

In a different vein, a number of authors examine the relation between interpretation and the discovery of intentions. Although that makes sense only for a somewhat limited sense of interpretation, intentions themselves need not be construed narrowly: Lumer's account conceives of the interpretation of human actions of all sorts as a matter of attributing intentions, where intentions are understood as the causes of action. To satisfy the ends of interpreting actions, he argues that we should seek "comprehensive intentions," comprising both implementation and goal intentions, but often not wholly accessible to the agent (pp. 131-2). What matters is whether they provide the knowledge we seek in interpreting particular actions. We might gloss that claim as a demand to make the action meaningful for the purposes for which we seek an interpretation. Perhaps then the interpretive goal of ascertaining intentions is simply part of a more general aim of revealing meaning or significance (cf. Gjesdal, p. 80; Borck, p. 194).

Adopting this approach suggests analogies between Lumer's conception and the uses of interpretation Schaffner and Borck find in medicine. Schaffner focuses mainly on interpretation as a matter of extracting a medical diagnosis from the welter of signs, symptoms and so forth that may (or may not) count as manifestations of disease. His discussion of the Internist-1 program of artificial intelligence shows that even in cases where the range of possible diseases is held fixed, the sheer combinatorial complexity of possible manifestations makes inference to the most likely diagnosis extremely difficult. Borck discusses how contemporary practices make diagnosis a kind of translation, but he is also concerned with broad issues of "interpretation as the making sense of a personal condition" and the "evaluation of therapeutic outcomes" (p. 196). Something similar figures in Gale's account of the "perceiving as" by which a cultivated palate may taste the qualities of wine not just as objective attributes or examples of classifiable properties, but as typical of their terroir. Pursuing this line may, however, stretch the notion of meaning-making too far. I am unsure whether it can really apply to Churchland's discussion of Hebbian learning. Churchland shows that a backward-feeding enforcement of synaptic connections allows brains to register, fill-in and "predict" complexly differentiated four-dimensional sequences from the earliest moments of perceptual experience. But even if this undermines some tenets of classical empiricism, one may wonder whether it really addresses the formation of genuine concepts and meaning. Does it apply at all to Gale's "perceiving as," or even better, to the sort of "two-foldedness" Richard Wollheim has identified for representational "seeing-in?"[2]

The aims of disclosing intentions and revealing meaning apply most readily to the interpretation of texts and similar cultural products. Even in this area, there remains plenty of room for disagreement about the scope of interpretation. Rescher takes it that an exegetical interpretation of a philosophical text tries to answer what it is "that the author of the text actually or probably intended to assert by it" (p. 95). In contrast, Lorand warns against confusing the "decoding" of authorial intention with the problem-solving work of interpretation (p. 21). Yet their disagreement may be only superficial. Rescher is not interested in recovering a psychological state, but in "rational analysis" as a form of exegesis. His "coherence theory of interpretation" (p. 97) approaches closely to Lorand's conception of interpretation as "the attempt to offer solutions to the apparent disturbances and salvage the object's unity, regardless of the original meaning" (p. 22). But unlike Lorand, Rescher insists that the task of fitting pieces together places the object-text into various contexts, related to the text through the biography of the author more or less distantly (p. 95). Lorand's account lacks such constraints, but that may simply be a result of her focus on scriptural exegesis, for which there is little available to fulfill Rescher's notions of nearby and peripheral context. The differences between their views might be finessed by either adjusting the relations between text and context or broadening the concept of the object of interpretation.

Both Lorand and Rescher take it that interpretation only enters the picture when there is a problem with the object to be interpreted. For Lorand, interpretation completes "an apparently incomplete object" (p. 24), while Rescher considers interpretation to aim at rectifying underdetermination, inaccuracy of expression, or inconsistency with context (pp. 92-3). Although Lorand is careful to specify that the incompleteness is apparent, Rescher suggests that the need for interpretation springs from inevitable human fallibility. This raises a worry: is interpretation only appropriate or possible when either the object or our access to it is flawed? Perhaps Rescher is correct that every human product shows human imperfection, but that is compatible with maintaining that the ideal of a well-constructed text is an uninterpretable one.

That seems an odd consequence, which raises troubling questions. Does any act of interpretation imply that the interpreter finds the object wanting, incomplete or disunified? In making A Fistful of Dollars, did Sergio Leone suppose there was something awry with Yojimbo? We might also question the ends Lorand and Rescher identify for interpretation, those of unity, coherence, and completion. Certainly, many interpretations aim at just those goals. But couldn't an interpretation adopt a different outlook? Consider Alexander Nehamas's interpretation of Nietzsche's corpus as fashioning a coherent, unified character for Nietzsche himself.[3] It seems at least possible to fashion a counter-reading, whereby Nietzsche's work seeks to undermine attempts at constructing a single position or persona in favor of seeing through many eyes, eyes turned in different and contrasting directions. Perhaps this would not be a better interpretation, but it does seem a possible one.

The real lesson of this example is that what counts as unity, completion and coherence can embrace plurality, incompleteness and tension, and is itself open to interpretation. But such flexibility means we can wonder whether these values do the work Rescher supposes. On his view, they generate "laws" guiding interpretation (see also Machamer, p. 13, but cf. Lorand, pp. 25-6). But the place of procedure and method in interpretation is contentious. Gadamer famously argues that we cannot adequately capture interpretive practices by any reasonably concrete notion of method; even if we restrict ourselves simply to revealing textual meaning, no methodology can instruct us in all and only the practices that allow us to understand the text, much less on how to engage in those practices.[4]

Rescher's "laws" and the uses made of it may illustrate the point. He identifies several principles of "context coherence", comprehensiveness, and sophistication. All of these are considerations we may use when evaluating philosophical, or indeed any textual exegesis (although as Rescher's fourth "law" of imperfectability acknowledges, they may pull in different directions). But what does it mean to count them as "laws"? Wilson offers one account of Leibniz's mill passage in the first half of her article, which she presents as an exemplification of Rescher's principles; Blank then offers another to "confirm Rescher's overall insight into the role of context in textual interpretation" (p. 126). Each offers an alternative choice for appropriate contexts. Wilson emphasizes Leibniz's disagreements with Gassendi and Locke, along with his ambitions for theodicy. Blank stresses coherence with Leibniz's early works, conformity to his basic ontology, and convergence with Rescher's other writings on Leibniz. Even if we confine our evaluation to "context coherence" and "comprehensiveness," how are we to decide which interpretation among those available coheres and comprehends best? How, for that matter, should we settle whether these interpretations truly diverge? These are genuine questions, but I suspect that they can only be addressed in actu, by continuing the work of interpretation -- not by applying laws of interpretation.

Note that my skepticism about the efficacy of such laws does not prevent me from making judgments about particular interpretations. I find Blank's interpretation of the mill argument in terms of its ontology to be enlightening, although many parts of Wilson's gloss are apropos. I also doubt that Gjesdal's piece gives due credit to Davidson's characterization of the early Socratic elenchus. But I do not make such (highly revisable) evaluations by consulting interpretive laws or procedures. Rescher insists on his laws in the face of what he sees as postmodern deconstruction and its willful blindness to "the crucial matter of purpose context" (p. 95). This is question-begging and perhaps uncharitable.[5] Nobody thinks that all interpretations, or all techniques for interpreting texts, are equally good, but many have plausibly maintained that it is difficult to give stable, uniform and universal criteria for good-making features. By the same token, particular interpretive practices may rely on distinctive methods, strategies and skills. But global procedural prescriptions run the risk of either excluding worthwhile practices or being framed in terms so vague and otiose as to be trivial.

Although I have tried to trace some common threads that might allow us to interpret the various forms of interpretation discussed here, I confess to continued uncertainty that any identifiable notion unites this collection. Readers looking for an overarching account of interpretation to cover the arts and sciences may find themselves disappointed. But perhaps others can do better than I. In any case, the collection presents such a wealth of diverse material that almost any reader will find something new and challenging. Like Machamer, I hope that it will inspire further investigation of kinds of interpretations -- and of course, more encounters between philosophy and wine.[6]

[1] See Mancosu, "Explanation in Mathematics," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2011 Edition), ed. E. N. Zalta.

[2] See Art and its Objects (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980), pp. 205-226.

[3] Life as Literature (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1985), pp. 277-8. For examples of readings that aim to be unsettled and to avoid "coherent" resolution, see Paul de Man, Allegories of Reading (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1979).

[4] See Truth and Method [Wahrheit und Methode], trans. J. Weinsheimer and D.G.Marshall (New York: Crossroad, 1989).

[5] Since the description may seem to fit Jacques Derrida, we should note his defense of the "instruments of traditional criticism" as forming an "indispensable guardrail," albeit one that "has always only protected, [and] never opened, a reading," in Of Grammatology, trans. G. Spivak (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1976), p. 158.

[6] Thanks to Graham Sullivan, Adam Morton, and Aladdin Yaqub for very helpful points.