Interpreting Averroes: Critical Essays

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Peter Adamson and Matteo Di Giovanni (eds.), Interpreting Averroes: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 262pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107114883.

Reviewed by Fouad Ben Ahmed, Al-Qarawiyine University, Rabat


Despite Ibn Rushd's fame and the abundance of writings about him, many aspects of his thought have not yet been, or are just beginning to be, studied in detail. This general impression emerges from reading at least some chapters of this collection edited by Peter Adamson and Matteo Di Giovanni. The book sheds new light on aspects of Ibn Rushd's work.

Adamson and Di Giovanni's introduction is followed by eleven chapters that were originally presented at a workshop in Munich on Ibn Rushd's thought. It considers various aspects of Ibn Rushd's extensive corpus and also aims to correct his image which it approaches in a new, or at least unusual way, by trying to recover the original context of his work. Surely, many students of Ibn Rushd's philosophy will be happy to have access to insightful analyses of his positions on natural philosophy and logic and subjects such as the internal senses and testimony, among others. The question that concerns me, however, is the extent to which the contributors have honored the commitment to recover Ibn Rushd's original context. Obviously, there isn't room to critique all the chapters here; instead, I will comment on some. Beyond some general remarks, I will focus on two points: the sometimes-incomplete reckoning with the growing secondary literature on Ibn Rushd, and the sometimes-faulty translations of his texts.

While interest in Ibn Rushd's writings has been strong almost continually since his death, it has increased considerably in recent decades, worldwide. Translations of his works in Europe were numerous during the Middle Ages and Renaissance, and debates over them were intense. However, critical editions of his texts in their original language began only in the mid-19th century and have since expanded, with increasing numbers of scholars working on his thought. The great interest in translating Ibn Rushd's works into Hebrew and Latin from the 12th century on and the great influence of these works on the discussions and debates among the scholastics have led modern scholarship to focus on certain aspects of Ibn Rushd's thought and on particular texts, marginalizing other aspects and texts. The exaggerated image that resulted from this bias ended up creating two profiles of Ibn Rushd. One is that of the "Great Commentator on Aristotle", referred to in philosophical, theological, ideological, and political debates that began in the Middle Ages. The other is that of a philosopher who failed to attract the attention of his contemporaries, his first audience, resulting in the death of his philosophy. This latter story is made to coincide with the putative age of intellectual decline in Muslim contexts, until the rebirth of the Arab Nahda (19th century), when Ibn Rushd became one of the subjects of the debate that took place mainly in Egypt and the Levant.

This book attempts to go beyond this split image. Its "goal has been, as it were, to recover the Ibn Rushd who stands behind Averroes" (1). According to the editors' introduction, the book aims "to offer the reader a well-rounded portrait of Averroes' thought within its historical and intellectual context. Hence we took the decision not to include chapters on his [European] reception, preferring such topics as his reaction to kalām or Islamic law" (2). This is the main reason why the chapters, on the one hand, focus on the evaluation of Ibn Rushd's contribution to logic and metaphysics, among other areas, in comparison to his predecessors -- notably al-Fārābī (d. 950), Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna, d. 1037), Ibn Bājja (Avempace, d. 1138) and Alexander of Aphrodisias (d. around 215) -- and why, on the other hand, it pays attention to Ibn Rushd's writings on the foundations of religion and jurisprudence (Chapters Three and Four), areas of his thought which are usually marginalized, if not excluded, from international research on Ibn Rushd.

There is no reason to blame a volume for not covering all the areas Ibn Rushd was interested in. Still, I believe that two very important aspects were excluded. Since the book is trying to introduce Ibn Rushd instead of Averroes, providing a chapter or two on the ancient and modern reception of Ibn Rushd's philosophy in Muslim societies would have been very useful to counter the widespread, harmful impression that Ibn Rushd had no legacy in medieval Muslim contexts and to revisit the ways the Arab Nahda received his texts and thoughts. The second missing aspect is a chapter on Ibn Rushd's politics, due to its importance in understanding his "evolved" position with regard to the Almohad regime under which he lived and which he supported at the beginning of his career.

In addition, although the book's objective is the recovery of the Ibn Rushd behind Averroes, choices are made throughout that do not help much to dust off Ibn Rushd. Although the editors claim that the target of their work is Ibn Rushd, and not the Latin name that succeeds it, they have chosen to use the Latin name, Averroes. If historical circumstances led to the use of the Latin name in the Middle Ages, it seems now that only "pragmatic" considerations cause us to continue using "Averroes", as if the name Ibn Rushd was not sufficient to meet these considerations. Recovering Ibn Rushd starts from recovering his historical name. Moreover, from the beginning, Ibn Rushd is introduced not as a philosopher but as a commentator, the famous Latin label. By way of comparison: the first thing the reader encounters in Adamson's introduction to his earlier Interpreting Avicenna: Critical Essays (Cambridge, 2013) is that he was "the greatest philosopher in the Islamic world." According to the introduction to Interpreting Averroes, Ibn Rushd remains, along with Alexander of Aphrodisias, Aristotle's greatest commentator before modern times, no more. Indeed, "Averroes" as a name corresponds perfectly to "the Commentator" as his title. In addition, although the reception of Ibn Rushd's thought in scholasticism and the Renaissance does not fall within the official purview of this book, it contains many references to the great success of Ibn Rushd's logic and medicine in Europe, but there is nothing concerning Ibn Rushd's reception in Muslim contexts, as mentioned above.

The chapters on Ibn Rushd's work on medicine and logic focus mainly on its great success in European medical schools, and he is depicted as having been unable to attract the attention of readers of the medieval Muslim contexts. With regard to logic, it is written that his logical writings "were studied and further developed" by Gersonides (d. 1344) and Agostino Nifo (ca. 1538); there is again total silence about what happened to his texts in Muslim contexts. Instead of looking for the impact of al-Kulliyāt on the medical tradition in Muslim contexts, the chapter on medicine only speaks of the Latin reception. Although Di Giovanni tries "to show that even these doctrines for which Averroes became universally known in the West cannot be understood in isolation from the indigenous context from which they arose" (11), it remains hard to see a link between Averroes' theory of intellect, which is basically a scholastic problematic that belongs to a specific European context, and the Andalusian context of Ibn Rushd.

Ziad Bou Akl's "Averroes on Juridical Reasoning" has two sections. The first, "The Cognitive Nature of Legal Operations," defends the idea that Ibn Rushd did not change his view in, al-Ḍarūrī fī uṣūl al-fiqh aw Mukhtaṣar al-Mustaṣfā (the Abridgement of al-Ghazālī's Muṣtasfā) and Bidāyat al-mujtahid wa nihāyat al-Muqtaṣid (the Jurist's Primer). In the second, "Juridical Qiyās and Aristotelian Exemplum in al-Fārābī," Bou Akl attempts to show the Farabian origin of "the distinction drawn by Averroes between what is specifically a qiyās in the legal field and what the jurists mistakenly take to be one" (46). Bou Akl's chapter is an almost exact translation of his introduction to Averroès: le philosophe et la Loi : édition, traduction et commentaire de l'"Abrégé du Mustasfa" (see 57-70)), his PhD dissertation (2015). Bou Akl seems confident that al-ʿAlawī has defended the idea of an evolution of Ibn Rushd's position toward the legal qiyās. He writes: "This is the position defended by Jamal al-Din al-Alawi . . . I do not think, though, that the position of Averroes has changed substantially throughout his career" (46). In his dissertation, however, Bou Akl was more cautious about al-ʿAlawī's position on Ibn Rushd's alleged evolution when he wrote: "C'est la position que semble soutenir al-ʿAlawī dans les notes de son edition" (le philosophe et la Loi, p. 57, n. 112). In fact, al-ʿAlawī is cautious about this topic, mainly due to the fact that the two texts do not belong to the same genre. (See al-ʿAlawī's introduction to his edition, p. 27, and p. 131, note 1).

In his chapter, Mokdad Arfa Mensia argues that Ibn Rushd "adopts a literalist approach to religion as he foregrounds the literal meaning (zāhir) of Scripture vis-à-vis its theological interpretations" (43). In my opinion, it would be reductionist to say that Ibn Rushd takes a zāhirist perspective, since this is, in effect, to analyze a complex position in terms of its simple components. The approach adopted by Ibn Rushd in Kitāb al-Kashf is two-dimensional: it systematically reveals the scientific and logical value of the statements made by theologians, and it unveils its dimensions and practical implications, because sharīʿa is ultimately a science and a practice "in the city". Therefore, Ibn Rushd's position on al-zāhir should be understood not only in its scientific dimension but should take into consideration practice, i.e., its parallel political dimension. Sustaining the zāhir of sharīʿa for the general population is not only a matter of individual knowledge and understanding for Ibn Rushd, but rather a practical and political matter. Interpretation, when not scientific and certain, as is the case with the Muslim theologians, leads to political errors and conflicts, as the history of Islam attests. When questions of practice do not come into consideration, Ibn Rushd accepts the interpretative approach to the sharīʿa, and as proof he interprets and adopts some of the Muʿtazilite interpretations (e.g., seeing God on the Day of Resurrection).

Lack of familiarity with the secondary literature is a serious problem for some of the contributors. Throughout, the chapters reflect almost total ignorance of anything written in Arabic about Ibn Rushd on medicine, jurisprudence, metaphysics and even his bio-bibliography. Given that the editors want to study Ibn Rushd's philosophy, taking into account its social and intellectual context, it seems appropriate to mention two thinkers who have greatly contributed to the development of research in that direction, but who are hardly mentioned in this volume: Jamāl al-Dīn al-ʿAlawī (al-Matn al-Rushdī: madkhal li-qirāʾa jadīda (1986)) and Muhammed al-Mesbāhī.

In his book, al-ʿAlawī defended two very important ideas. The first is that Ibn Rushd's thinking and writings have an internal unity, even though his interests extended over philosophical, scientific, theological, and religious domains. The second is that his thinking evolved over time and that this evolution is reflected by two things: first, that Ibn Rushd returned more than once to the same subject, in the form of a new commentary on the same text or an "independent" treatise; second, that he rewrote some of his works, so that today there is more than one version of writings such as al-Kashf an manāhij al-addila, al-Kulliyāt fī al-Tibb, and Talkhīs kitab al-Nafs. These ideas, critical to Ibn Rushd's thought, receive no attention in the present volume, not even in chapters 9 and 11 where they ought to have been found.

In addition, al-ʿAlawī conducted detailed studies on the theory of demonstration and on the relations between philosophical sciences, such as between physics and metaphysics. About the latter, he argued that Ibn Rushd was the first philosopher who made it a philosophical issue (see "Ishkāliyat al-ʿalāqat bayn al-ʿilm al-ṭabīʿī wa mā baʿda al-ṭabīʿa ʿinda Ibn Rushd" ("The Problematic of the Relation between Physics and Metaphysics in Ibn Rushd"), Revue de la Faculté des Lettres de Fès, n. 3 (1988): 8), and revealed the limits of Ibn Rushd's approach compared to Ibn Sīnā and Alexander of Aphrodisias. Another Moroccan scholar, Muhammed al-Mesbāhī, has treated the same issue more recently, showing that the relationship between philosophy and science is not that of form and matter, but of two domains that overlap at their borders. The difference between metaphysics and physics lies in the focus and scope of vision. For example, the latter provides the former with its subject, which means that there is no way to prove the first principle except through natural philosophy, while Ibn Rushd gives metaphysics the right to control and generally prove the principles of the former. See "Haq al-naẓar fi al-mabādiʾ al-ʾūla bayn al-falsafa wa al-ʿilm ʿinda Ibn Rushd" ("The Right to First Principles Between Philosophy and Science According to Ibn Rushd"), Alif: Journal of Comparative Poetics 16 (1996): 52-76.

Adamson's "Averroes on Divine Causation" treats this crucial question "what is the relation of physics to metaphysics?" According to Adamson, Ibn Rushd "rejected Avicenna's strategy of proving the existence of God within metaphysics, insisting that the only way to establish this is by reasoning from the existence of eternal motion, which is a task for physics" (198). Adamson's chapter and the two mentioned in the previous paragraph often converge. But, although Adamson follows the same approach and uses the same texts as those previous studies, he treats the issue as if nothing was written in Arabic about it. In addition to avoiding reading what was already read, using previous articles would certainly enrich current studies and improve our understanding of the issue.

Joël Chandelier ("Averroes on Medicine") begins by saying that little has been written on Ibn Rushd's medical contributions. Observing that Ibn Rushd's work in the field of medicine was abundant and included commentaries, independent works and summaries, Chandelier states "This part of his intellectual activity has interested few" (158). In other words, "The question remains of his goal in paraphrasing Galen, or in writing a general treatise on the art of medicine. Researchers have largely ignored this question, especially if we compare it with the extensive research that has been conducted on his philosophical work" (158). Unfortunately, apart from the biography of Ibn Abī Uṣaybi'a, Chandelier has omitted all studies and monographs written in Arabic.

In fact, Ibn Rushd's medical writings occupy a very important place in al-ʿAlawī's work, (e.g., al-Matn al-rushdī). It would have been very interesting to engage with what he said about it. In fact, what drew al-ʿAlawī's attention was not only the philological problem caused by Ibn Rushd's compiling al-Kulliyāt fī al-Ṭibb and writing new versions of it, nor only his Commentary on Ibn Sīnā's Poem on Medicine -- which challenges the usual conception of a rivalry between the two great philosophers -- but rather the great change that took place in Ibn Rushd's scientific career through his commenting on and paraphrasing Galen's work. The latter began to occupy an important place near the end of Ibn Rushd's intellectual life. This change in Ibn Rushd's career was a challenge for al-ʿAlawī. It seemed to al-ʿAlawī that Ibn Rushd had been forced to suddenly stop his philosophical project of writing the long commentaries on Aristotle's texts, and to turn instead to Galen's text on medicine (see al-Matn al-rushdī, 91-94, 99-100, 113, 114-117, 174-175, 240-242). All these significant details that are relevant to understanding the changes in Ibn Rushd's philosophical career path, which, in turn, need to be reviewed, are unnoticed by Chandelier.

Ibn Rushd's most prominent medical treatise, al-Kulliyāt fī al-Ṭibb, has been edited and published many times. At least two editions considered Bonacosa's Latin translation of the text and Ibn Rushd's multiple Arabic versions. In 1947, Manuel Alonso raised the issue of the existence of a second version of the text written by Ibn Rushd (La teologia de Averroes, 71). In 1986, Helmut Gätje detailed the differences between the versions according to the manuscripts in Turkey, Granada and Madrid in addition to the Hebrew and Latin translations. Only Bonacosa's Latin translation, none of those Arabic manuscripts and Hebrew translations, contains the last version or at least the most complete one. Bonacosa's Latin translation also has an introduction that is not found in the other manuscripts of al-Kulliyāt. Based on Gätje's findings, Ahmed Mahfoud, for example, in his introduction to the 1999 edition, developed a comparison between the five available manuscripts and concluded that Ibn Rushd left at least three versions of al-Kulliyāt, and Mahfoud inserted that unique introduction (translated back into Arabic) in the beginning of his edition. It is regretable that Chandelier talks about only two versions of al-Kulliyāt (see p. 160), resulting in a more limited consideration of Ibn Rushd's medical writing.

There are instances in which misunderstanding Ibn Rushd's words lead to unjustified claims. One example is Chandelier's claim that action is not central to al-Kulliyāt -- that is, to show "Averroes' insistence on the limits of medical science" (167). These limits, according to Chandelier, can be seen in his definition of medicine at the beginning of al-Kulliyāt. The definition is presented as: "we say that the art of medicine is an operational art (sināʿa fāʿila) taken from true principles, by which we seek the preservation of the health of the human body and the removal of disease, according to what is possible in each body." Chandelier comments that: "The described aim of medicine is, frankly, modest" (167). Following the rest of the definition, he says: "For Averroes, its goal is not exactly to heal in every case, but to do 'what is necessary according to the appropriate measure and moment, then to wait for the result to occur, as in the case of navigation or military technique'." This, however, hardly does justice to Ibn Rushd's actual words. The Arabic definition of medicine at the beginning of al-Kulliyāt is:

Inna ṣīnāʿt al-ṭṭīb hiya ṣīnāʿt fāʿīlāt ʿān mābādiʾ ṣādiqat, yultamas bihā ḥifẓ ṣiḥḥat badan al-īnsān wa ibṭāl al-maraḍ, waḏalik biʾaqṣā mā yumkin fī wāḥid wāḥid min al-ʾabdān; faʾinna haḏihi al-ṣnāʿat laysa ġāyatuhā an tubriʾa walābud, bal an tafʿal mā yajib bi al-miqdār al-laḏī yajib wa fī al-waqt al-laḏī yajib, ṯumma yantaẓir ḥuṣūl ġāyatihā, kā al-ḥāl fī ṣināʿẗ al-milāḥt wa qūd al-juyūsh (Mahfoud's edition, Beirūt, 1999, p. 127)

This could be translated as:

The art of medicine is an art that acts based on true principles (ṣināʿa fāʿila ʿan mabādiʾ ṣādiqa); we seek through it to preserve the health of the human body and to eliminate disease as much as possible in each body (fī wāḥid wāḥid min al-abdān). The purpose of this art is not inevitably (wa lābudda) to achieve healing, but rather to act appropriately in the appropriate time and extent, while waiting to achieve its purpose, as happens in the art of navigation and the command of the army.

In fact, then, the aim of medicine al-Kulliyāt presents is not modest but descriptive, determined by the nature of the sphere to which medicine belongs. The definition is based on the famous division of the arts into what belongs to the sphere of the necessary and what belongs to the sphere of the possible. The art of medicine does not belong to the sphere of necessity, where consequences inevitably follow actions, as happens in other arts, like carpentry. In medicine, even if the physician acts on the basis of scientific principles, healing does not necessarily follow. Yes, the goal of the art of medicine is to heal in every case, but that goal is not necessarily reached. This is the nature of the arts that belong to the world of the possible.

Once the definition suggested by al-Kulliyāt is fully understood and rightly translated, the status of action in the art of medicine becomes clear. Action turns out to be central to al-Kulliyāt in just the way it is in the Commentary on Ibn Sīnā's Poem on Medicine, where Ibn Rushd insists that "medicine is an art whose action is preserving heath by curing the disease based on science and experiment."

Another example of confusion, minor this time, is on page 167, where the reference at note 37 is not correct. The reference should be to Ibn Rushd's Commentary on Temperaments, p. 74, and not to al-Kulliyāt.

It might be worth indicating what seem to me additional shortcomings of this book. As mentioned, some chapters don't bring much new to the accumulated research. Also, there are problems in the translation and understanding of some of the quotations from Ibn Rushd, e.g., about medicine and metaphysics. One example is the translation (in Chapter Three) of (shāhid) and (ghāʾib) consistently as "visible" and "invisible" when it has to do with analogy. The intended meaning is the known and unknown regardless of being visible or not. It has to do mainly with the judgment that is available (we know it already) and another that is unavailable, to which we are transferred from the former. A second example is the claim that Ibn Rushd holds that the Poem on Medicine by Ibn Sīnā is "by far the best introduction to medical science" (165). To be precise, although Ibn Rushd did say that the Poem on Medicine is clear and simple, he did not say that it is the best introduction. To quote Ibn Rushd, it is "better than many of the introductions written in medicine" (Annahā afḍal min kathīr min al-madākhil al-llatī wuḍiʿat fī al-ṭibb). Another example of mistranslation/ misunderstanding is in the long text cited on page 171, where Chandelier inserted the word "medicine" instead of "anatomy," although it is the latter that the text compares with the movements of the spheres.

On page 208, Adamson quotes a long text from Ibn Rushd's commentary on Lambda, 1433-1434. He translates in line 2 "lā yaqdirʿalā iʿṭāʾ ḏālik" as "he cannot deal with . . . ", while the proper translation would be "he cannot supply . . . ". In line 9 he translates "wahiya al-ʾusṭuqsāt al-latī tūjad li al-mawjūd bimā huwa mawjūd" as "these are the elements which make being qua being exist" while the correct translation is: "These are the elements that exist for the being as being." The text is addressing the elements of being, and not the elements that make being exist, since the elements don't have that power.

On page 215, in the first quotation, Adamson omits the adjective "celestial" in his translation. He translates the Arabic text: "mabādiʾ sāʾir al-ḥarakāt al-samāwiyya" (p. 1604 in Ibn Rushd's text) as "the principles of the other motions." But the text actually is: "the principles of the other celestial motions."

On page 215, in the second quotation Adamson translates the Arabic sentence "kān al-muḥarrik al-ʾawwal yuḥarrik ilā jamīʿ al-ṣuwar" (p. 1529 in Ibn Rushd's text) as: "the first mover moves all forms," while the correct translation would be "the first mover moves [everything] to all forms". Adamson missed the preposition "ilā" which, I presume, changes the meaning. So, the first mover moves "everything" to its form, so that the form in the text of Ibn Rushd is not a subject of the motion, but rather its end.

The recovery of Ibn Rushd requires a critical examination of the accumulated studies on Ibn Rushd and a comprehensive examination of aspects of his philosophy and writings working within his context. This is still far from being achieved. Interpreting Averroes is meant to be "critical", as its subtitle suggests, but that is where some of its limits lie. Some chapters are merely introductions to aspects of Ibn Rushd's thought (e.g., those on ethics and medicine). In a nutshell, writing about a subject like Ibn Rushd has never been an easy task. It is more difficult because of Ibn Rushd's fame, his broad-ranging corpus, and his appeal to scholars and researchers around the world for decades, all contributing to a significant scholarly literature that should not be ignored. Studies in Arabic are part of that literature; they are not intended only for "domestic consumption". The emphasis I place on integrating Arabic studies of Ibn Rushd into the literature has a twofold purpose: the acceptance of these studies as part of the international scholarship on Ibn Rushd and their improvement through the interaction and criticism they receive when not isolated from current global thinking about Ibn Rushd's work. Let us write a truly connected history of Ibn Rushd's thought!

Because the ideas of Ibn Rushd have so deeply impressed so many throughout the centuries, it has been judged necessary, from time to time, to recover the "real" Ibn Rushd. Interpreting Averroes is such an attempt. Whether it (or any similar endeavor) achieves its objective is an inevitable question.