Interpreting Avicenna: Critical Essays

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Peter Adamson (ed.), Interpreting Avicenna: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 300pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521190732.

Reviewed by Thérèse-Anne Druart, The Catholic University of America


Books giving an overview of the whole of Avicenna’s works are few and far between. In 2010 Jon McGinnis offered such an overview in the Oxford University Press series “Great Medieval Thinkers.” The aim of the book edited by Peter Adamson is quite different and so does not reduplicate it in any way. McGinnis gives a philosophical and fairly systematic presentation of Avicenna’s views and arguments that also includes a section on medicine and another on the Avicennan heritage. Though following a similar outline, Adamson asked the contributors to focus on cutting-edge research and more specific issues inside particular fields, such as logic, metaphysics, etc. The point was not to present the basic and more studied views of Avicenna, but rather to pay attention to what has been little studied or deserves more study. The two books nicely complement each other. For instance, if one has no grounding in Avicenna’s metaphysics, it would be better to begin with McGinnis’s two chapters on the topic and then move to more specific issues as presented by Stephen Menn and Peter Adamson, even if the title of Menn’s chapter is simply “Avicenna’s Metaphysics.”

Interpreting Avicenna offers nine chapters on Avicenna and his philosophy and medicine followed by three on the reception of his philosophy and medicine first in the Islamic world, then in the Jewish world, and finally in the Medieval Latin world. Let us begin with the sections on Avicenna and his philosophy and medicine. The late David C. Reisman gives a very detailed account of how patronage influenced Avicenna’s work. Avicenna led an eventful life and worked under a variety of patrons. Reisman relates each type of patronage to a type of work: first, expository works for the patrons, then polemical works, and finally works for his own disciples. This is an interesting thesis, and Reisman backs it up with an examination of manuscripts. Yet, the complexities of historical events in Avicenna’s times make this paper somewhat difficult to follow for someone trained more in philosophy than Islamic studies.

Dimitri Gutas offers as a general philosophical introduction an abridged version of the concluding chapter of the fully revised edition of his 1988 Avicenna and the Aristotelian Tradition, which just came out. He highlights how Avicenna developed the genre of the “Summae” (he wrote no less than eight of them) and in fact in the East ended up supplanting Aristotle.

Often Avicenna’s logic gets neglected since not much of it was translated into Latin in the Middle Ages, as is the case for translations into modern languages. Tony Street focuses on the syllogism and modal syllogistic in particular in one of Avicenna’s late works, the Pointers or Ishârât. Street selected this text as it represents the final views of Avicenna on this topic and in the East completely supplanted Aristotelian logic. Street points out that Avicenna goes beyond Aristotle in considering logic both as a science in itself and as an instrument for the other sciences. For Avicenna the foundations of logic are metaphysical, but the many connections between Avicenna’s logic and metaphysics up to now have been little explored. The chapter ends with an invaluable appendix: a bibliographical guide to Avicenna’s logical works (pp. 67-70). Street's chapter will both interest and fascinate logicians.

In his paper on Avicenna’s natural philosophy Jon McGinnis deals with “a complex of interrelated issues,” some drawn from Aristotle and others from Kalâm or Islamic theology. Avicenna, aware of inconsistencies or difficulties in Aristotle, tried to resolve some of them. They concern the form of motion as well as the continuum. As the theologians defended a form of atomism, whereas Aristotle rejected it, Avicenna had to face this issue and was a passionate defender of the continuum. Despite his defense of the continuum, he also wished to argue for natural minima, a non-Aristotelian view. At first blush natural minima and atomism seem to go hand in hand, but Avicenna cleverly disentangled them by simply arguing that a definite quantitative range is required for the preservation of the form above or below which the form cannot be sustained. McGinnis also addresses the issue of primary mixtures that is solved in using the minima naturalia. As Latin readers did not have access to the last part of Avicenna’s Physics, Book III, which treats of the latter topic, they could not make much sense of what Avicenna said on mixtures. McGinnis's very interesting and clear paper highlights Avicenna’s originality and discrete way of taking distance from some of Aristotle’s positions.

Peter E. Pormann provides some answers to the disputed topic of whether or not Avicenna really did practice medicine and concludes that he did, even if his main interest was in medical theory. In philosophical circles Avicenna’s views on the inner senses have attracted much attention, but what Avicenna says in his medical works about common sense and estimation, both seated in the brain, has been mostly ignored. Pormann shows that in such works Avicenna examines common sense but does not deal with estimation as “the damage to its functions result [sic] from damage to other lesser faculties” though he does not object to acknowledging its existence (106). Hence Pormann concludes that Avicenna’s philosophical views influenced his medical texts. He ends with a call to philosophers and historians to examine much more closely Avicenna’s medical works.

In “Avicenna’s epistemological optimism”, Dag Nikolaus Hasse faces the hot issue of whether for Avicenna intellectual knowledge comes from emanation of the active intellect or depends on the human capacities for abstraction. Briefly reviewing the history of this issue, Hasse examines two recent attempts to solve it, one by Cristina D’Ancona and the other by McGinnis. Though criticizing their solutions, he takes some of their research into account. He argues that epistemologically universal material forms are first abstracted. Once they are fully abstracted, the form emanates from the active intellect. Such abstraction is only needed for the first acquisition of a form. This guarantees realism since the very same active intellect contains the material form as universal and is the ontological source by emanation of the material form in the particulars. Hasse’s exposition of the issue is very clear, but his solution still seems to me simply to displace the problem. If full abstraction is necessary for the emanation of the material form on our intellect, why do we consider it a complete abstraction? Or, in other words, why do we still need an emanation?

Deborah L. Black focuses on “Certitude, justification, and the principles of knowledge in Avicenna’s epistemology.” Her paper illustrates the intricacies and sophistication of Avicenna’s epistemic psychology. Taking her point of departure from the epistemic classification of the principles of syllogisms, she analyzes the different types of propositions and their degrees of epistemic certitude from mathematical principles, to sensible and empirical propositions, to testimony, authority and consensus. Certitude may be attained even if the propositions do not fit the criteria laid down by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics, but always requires that the knower know that he or she knows. Self-awareness of one’s epistemic attitude is a necessary condition. So certitude for Avicenna combines many naturalistic elements with a subjective aspect, as “self-awareness is our most fundamental cognitive act” (141). This paper is a refreshing change from a too common overemphasis on demonstration stricto sensu.

The importance of Avicenna’s metaphysics led Adamson to commission two papers about it. Menn’s “Avicenna’s metaphysics” relies on the Cure or Shifâ’ and states that Avicenna tries to realize what Aristotle intended not only in his explicit statements about metaphysics but also in his way of doing metaphysics while taking into account what two of his predecessors, al-Fârâbî (d. 950) and Ibn ‘Adî (d. 974) had done. For Menn in the Cure Avicenna systematizes and organizes everything around the notion of being (al-mawjûd). He also develops and goes more deeply into points made by Aristotle in Metaphysics, Book V. Menn centers on the discussion of being in Book I, of unity and numbers in Book III, and on some issues about universals. This chapter is very rich but compact, and presupposes a good knowledge of al-Fârâbî and Ibn ‘Adî. Among other issues Menn, of course, asks whether being and unity are predicated univocally of things in all categories, even though being is said of them by priority and posteriority, but wisely does not offer a solution to this topic, which deserves a thorough examination. This paper gives much food for thought, but may tackle too many issues at the same time.

By contrast Adamson deals with one issue: how Avicenna moves from his proof for the existence of the necessary existent to a conception of God by means of his deduction of the necessary existent’s attributes. He argues that Avicenna’s strategy consists in showing how from the necessary existent conceived as uncaused and from the claim that this necessary existent is itself a cause -- both claims being implied in the proof for its existence -- one can deduce many attributes, such as uniqueness, simplicity, ineffability from the fact that the necessary existent is uncaused, and intellection, goodness, and other relational attributes from the fact that it is the ultimate cause. In order to make his case, Adamson uses a range of texts. His essay is very clear and well organized.

The section on the impact of Avicenna on various cultures yields surprising results. Avicenna had great impact on all three cultures: Islamic, Jewish, and Latin. In each case, however, a different text produced the impact. Robert Wisnovsky shows that in the East up to the 16th Century the most influential text was the Ishârât or Pointers, even if later on commentaries on the Shifâ’ became much more numerous. On the Jewish side Gad Freudenthal and Mauro Zonta indicate that overt references to Avicenna’s philosophical texts and the main Hebrew translation was that of the Najât. Maimonides made much use of Avicenna but did not refer to him overtly. Yet, Avicenna’s medical work was well known in Jewish circles. Amos Bertolacci indicates that for the Latins the text was the Shifâ’. In each case one must distinguish textual uses from adoptions with eventual modifications of some doctrines or insights.

Wisnovsky claims that in the East just as Avicenna had tried to harmonize Aristotle with himself in resolving tensions in his works, so post-Avicennan philosophers tried to harmonize Avicenna with himself in resolving tensions in his views. In Sunni milieus since the beginning of the twentieth century Avicennianism is no longer the dominant philosophical movement, whereas in the Shî’î-Iranian intellectual culture it still predominates. Wisnovsky shows how recently much has been discovered about the post-Classical period in Islamic lands, but, maybe because for him it is obvious, he does not indicate that we still have much to discover.

Freudenthal and Zonta make the case that in the Middle Ages there was not one Jewish culture but rather two Jewish cultures, depending on the main language used. Therefore, they divide their chapter into Avicenna amongst Arabophone Jews and Avicenna amongst Hebrew-writing Jews. For instance, the work of Arabophone Jews shows knowledge of various texts of Avicenna, while the work of those writing in Hebrew shows knowledge of the Epistle on the Soul and the Najât, which were available in Hebrew translation.  There were no less than three very popular translations into Hebrew of al-Ghazâlî’s Aims of the philosophers, which is basically an Arabic translation with some modifications of one of Avcienna’s Persian works. Since Hebrew-writers were unaware of its Avicennian pedigree, it was only an indirect source  for them.

Bertolacci indicates that there are many scattered studies (focusing on very specific points) of the influence of Avicenna on various Medieval Latin authors, but that no comprehensive and general study is available. He rightly deplores that the period between the translations and Albert the Great is ignored, though we know, for instance, that Roger Bacon took Avicenna seriously. On pp. 246-47 Bertolacci gives a very useful table of the Latin translations of the Shifâ’ with date, place, number of manuscripts, editions, etc.

Interpreting Avicenna is not an introduction to Avicenna’s philosophy, but a series of scholarly essays enriching our knowledge of often little studied aspects of Avicenna’s thought. Some (e.g., Wisnovsky) highlight unresolved tensions in Avicenna. Some (like McGinnis) show how much Avicenna tries to resolve tensions in Aristotle and goes far beyond what Aristotle said. Some, like Black with her study of certitude and different types of syllogistic propositions, go in depth into up until now rather unchartered territories. Several point to research that needs to be done and can be a source of inspiration for graduate students looking for a dissertation topic. Some (e.g., Adamson) are fairly easy to read, but others are somewhat opaque if one does not have yet a solid grounding in Avicenna’s texts and Arabic philosophy. Most are challenging and well worth reading, even if at times controversial.

The book includes an extensive bibliography and a good index. It should be on the shelf of any serious academic library, even if its title may cause some bibliographical confusion. The book was published in a quasi series, “Interpreting X”. Therefore, the title had to be Interpreting Avicenna, but another book had already been published under this title (Interpreting Avicenna: Science and Philosophy in Medieval Islam, Jon McGinnis and Reisman, eds.,2004). So it is best to refer to Adamson’s book by both title and subtitle as only the subtitles and dates of publications distinguish these two books.