Interpreting Bergson: Critical Essays

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Alexandre Lefebvre and Nils F. Schott (eds.), Interpreting Bergson: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 238pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108421157.

Reviewed by Heath Massey, Beloit College


In the introduction to Creative Evolution, Henri Bergson sketches an approach to philosophy that would combine epistemology with evolutionary biology in order to show how the human intellect emerges as an adaptive response to our environment and why the concepts employed by this faculty are poorly suited for grasping the diversity, complexity, and creativity of life. Ambitious as it sounds, he regards this project as the beginning of a larger enterprise:

Unlike the philosophical systems properly so called, each of which was the individual work of a man of genius and sprang up as a whole, to be taken or left, [such a philosophy] will only be built up by the collective and progressive effort of many thinkers, of many observers also, completing, correcting, and improving one another. (xiv)

Bergson seems to have understood that the age of philosophical system-building was coming to an end and that the fate of his work depended on how well it engaged the imagination and curiosity of others.

It is in this spirit of philosophy as a collective and progressive effort that this book makes valuable contributions to the ongoing renaissance of Bergson scholarship. The volume is not an introduction to Bergson and his major themes, but a collection of successful attempts to expand the conversation about his work to include different voices and afford new perspectives. It is well known that Bergson became one of the most influential philosophers in early twentieth century Europe, that attention to his work waned in the interwar years, and that a resurgence of interest occurred with the reception of Gilles Deleuze's Bergsonism. As Suzanne Guerlac notes in her contribution, Deleuze's success in reviving Bergson's ideas was due largely to his reading Bergson in the light of transformations in the sciences and in society. She suggests that even more recent developments "invite us to bring him out of the intellectual isolation that affected the New Bergson (the anti-philosopher) and to read him in dialogue with other thinkers" (105). This is exactly what the volume's essays do: they illuminate Bergson's thought by holding it up to the light produced by an exciting array of other thinkers. The result is a fascinating and thought-provoking set of efforts to broaden the current conversation around Bergson's work.

The first essay, Arnaud François' "Bergson's Theory of Truth," takes a crucial topic that Bergson never treated systematically and brings together his key insights on it. Beginning with Bergson's "On the Pragmatism of William James," François argues that Bergson develops a novel conception of truth as something invented rather than discovered. The difficulty is to understand how truth can be invented without being arbitrary, which he addresses with regard to three of Bergson's insights: first, truth pertains to problems as well as propositions; second, truth follows the articulations of the real; and third, truth is made (rather than simply seen) through intuition. François skillfully gathers together disparate reflections by Bergson on the nature of truth and reality, highlighting his strategy of attacking false problems and his theory of general ideas, in connection with which he invokes Canguilhem and Deleuze, unfortunately without much elaboration. François concludes that Bergson's view connects truth in the sciences with truth in the arts. Missing from this discussion, except for a brief mention, is Bergson's theory of the retrograde movement of the true, which he offers to explain the traditional view of truth as eternal.

Giuseppe Bianco's "What Was 'Serious Philosophy' for the Young Bergson?" situates his thought in his intellectual milieu, offering a detailed history of the institutions and agents responsible for the formation of philosophy as a discipline in nineteenth-century France. Taking the idea of serious philosophy as a contested site of knowledge production, Bianco aims to show how Bergson's early work displays a strategy of adaptation to the norms of what counts as legitimate work in philosophy. His discussion follows the evolution of spiritualism in the academy under the leadership of Victor Cousin, Félix Ravaisson, and others, in competition with the positivism of Comte and in reaction to developments in psychology and medicine (which Bergson once intended to study). Bianco argues that "philosophy's legitimizing axiom" (31) involved a certain view that emphasized the mind's unity, agency, and immateriality in the face of challenges by empirical psychology. He succeeds in showing how Bergson's milieu was shaped by the demands for philosophy to respect and engage with the natural sciences while preserving human freedom and employing introspection as a method. However, more discussion would be welcome about how Bergson's Essai sur les données immédiates de la conscience meets these demands, which particular models of seriousness he follows, and what strategies he uses to adapt. Nevertheless, Bianco has paved the way well for future research into Bergson's dialogue with the natural sciences and his idea of philosophy and science as indispensable complements.

Stéphane Madelrieux's "Bergson and Naturalism" explores the question of whether Bergson should be viewed as a naturalist, given his efforts to understand the human mind and social behavior in biological terms. He entertains the possibility that Bergson's later work represents a new naturalism in the same vein as James' pragmatism, providing an alternative to reductionist materialism and spiritualism. According to Madelrieux, Bergson's third way concedes that there is a difference in kind between humans and non-human animals, but conceives of this difference within a broader unity of life and the élan vital. While Bergson may naturalize the intellect by treating it as a product of evolution, Madelrieux claims, he remains committed to "a fundamentally antinaturalist metaphysical position" (55). He argues that Bergson asserts a primacy of mind over life, views life as directed by a supraconsciousness prior to human consciousness, and employs a method of discovering differences in kind that results in a dualistic and hierarchical ontology. This critique cuts against the grain of Deleuze's interpretation in interesting ways, linking Bergson's philosophy to the metaphysics of Herbert Spencer and borrowing John Dewey's critique of Spencer for attempting to ground epistemic and moral authority on the principle of evolution. Ultimately, while Madelrieux's critique poses a forceful challenge to the image of Bergson as an original thinker, it overlooks the possibility that the categories naturalist and antinaturalist fail to capture the nuances of his thought.

One of the most famous and often criticized aspects of Bergson's philosophy is his critique of the human intellect. Leonard Lawlor complicates a common view of Bergson as an anti-intellectualist in "Bergson on the True Intellect." In Creative Evolution and subsequent works, Bergson famously contrasts the intellect and instinct, characterizing the former as capable of dealing with matter, but not life. However, Lawlor reveals another, mostly unnoticed, side of the intellect which Bergson links with invention. He develops this distinction rigorously through a close reading of Bergson's "Intellectual Effort" that clarifies Bergson's concept of the dynamic schema and proposes an original answer to the question what is the virtual? Lawlor is characteristically attentive to the rich examples that Bergson uses to illustrate this concept, providing interesting and sometimes surprising insights into a neglected aspect of his thought, namely the role that the intellect plays in creativity. Lawlor's novel interpretation, drawing implicitly on Deleuze as well as Merleau-Ponty, overturns the common wisdom that intellect for Bergson is, as Bertrand Russell scoffed, the misfortune of man. On the contrary, the true intellect rejoins intuition and assists in realizing the unforeseen. Lawlor successfully disrupts the apparent dichotomy between intellect and intuition that has been the focus of some of Bergson's harshest critics.

As the thinker of creative evolution, Bergson may not have developed an aesthetic theory, but his thoughts are never far from art and literature. In "Bergson's Philosophy of Art," Mark Sinclair traces a thread through his corpus by which Bergson ties together the creative process and the novelty of life itself. Drawing from an impressive array of sources, Sinclair examines a tension in Bergson's philosophy between the view, first developed in Laughter, that art is the revelation of things unnoticed, and the idea that art involves genuine creation of the new. Sinclair emphasizes Bergson's reliance on Kant's aesthetics for distinguishing between art and craft, a more interesting association lies in his reading of a footnote to Creative Evolution commenting on the aesthetic theory of Gabriel Séailles. While sympathetic to Séailles' rejection of the idea that artistic genius creates ex nihilo, Bergson insists that creation is more than a synthesis of elements. Sinclair turns to Bergson's "The Possible and the Real" to show how the tension between creation and revelation remains unresolved, as Bergson argues that genius has a retroactive effect on the past, revealing unnoticed aspects of previous literary works and movements, while also claiming that genius creates from scratch. In a provocative gesture that calls for further elaboration, Sinclair suggests that the main problem with Bergson's aesthetics is its dependence on an "untenably voluntaristic" metaphysics.

Guerlac's "Bergson, the Time of Life, and the Memory of the Universe" takes the debate between Bergson and Einstein on the nature of time as a point of departure for exploring Bergson's philosophy of time. Guerlac attacks Deleuze's claim that Bergson goes beyond a psychological concept of duration to develop an ontological one by showing how Bergson preserves the relationship between duration and consciousness in Duration and Simultaneity, such that impersonal time implies individual duration rather than eliminating it. She goes on to connect the analogical movement by which Bergson arrives at a notion of universal duration with Friedrich Schelling's philosophy of nature, as presented by Merleau-Ponty in his Nature lectures. Bergson's idea of a universe that not only endures but lives puts him in proximity with Schelling in a way that recalls the account of habit developed by Bergson's teacher Ravaisson. Turning to Matter and Memory, Guerlac demonstrates how Bergson's view of bodily memory is informed by Ravaisson's description of habit as intelligent rather than merely mechanical, as illustrated by his theory of drawing pedagogy. The Schelling-Ravaisson-Bergson-Deleuze lineage deserves further exploration, and Guerlac establishes valuable signposts. However, the suggestion that Bergson's philosophy should be engaged in terms of an ontology of time, not being, is a bit puzzling, as is the claim that Deleuze reads Bergson as abandoning psychology for ontology. Another possibility is that Deleuze means to emphasize Jean Hyppolite's point that psychologistic interpretations (such Martin Heidegger's) ignore the ways Bergson expands the scope of duration in Matter and Memory, Creative Evolution, and, as Guerlac has adeptly shown, Duration and Simultaneity.

In "Bergson and Philosophy as a Way of Life," Keith Ansell-Pearson builds on the work of Pierre Hadot to recommend a development of Bergson's philosophy as fundamentally concerned with the art of living. Ansell-Pearson thus presents Bergson as an heir to the Stoics and Epicureans who, despite their significant differences, regarded philosophy as "a set of practices or exercises that seek to transform one's way of life" (124). On this interpretation, Bergsonian intuition is not just a method for solving philosophical problems, but a kind of spiritual exercise. Hadot reads Bergson as one who teaches us to see things from the perspective of the Whole, which Ansell-Pearson elucidates in several ways. First, this means enlarging our perception to see the world sub specie durationis, i.e., as enduring. It also means turning our attention from what is ordinarily useful or interesting to a more aesthetic mode of perception. Finally, it means freeing ourselves from the human condition and the need for mastery over the material world. The key to this enlargement of perception is sympathy, which is not merely a feeling or psychological state, but a means of connection and communication with other forms of life. As each of us is part of a whole that is perpetually changing, Bergson contends, we have capacity to stop picturing this whole as external to us and to discover it within. Following Hadot's critique of Michel Foucault's appropriation of ancient practices of care for the self, Ansell-Pearson offers Bergson's care for life as a whole as an alternative. By placing his affiliation with ancient schools of practical wisdom in the foreground, Ansell-Pearson presents a new Bergson that is not altogether unfamiliar.

The final four chapters focus on themes explored by Bergson in his last book, The Two Sources of Morality and Religion. In "Bergson and Social Theory," Alexandre Lefebvre and Melanie White approach Bergson as a thinker engaging with pioneers of sociology and developing his own social theory. Their discussion is helpfully structured around three guiding problems: social cohesion, the origins of society, and social change. They demonstrate how Bergson develops his view on each problem in dialogue with his contemporary (and in some respects rival) Durkheim, on the one hand, and their predecessor Comte, on the other. Admitting that Bergson rarely cites these thinkers, Lefebvre and White nevertheless show convincingly how Bergson begins with an account of obligation closely resembling Durkheim's but rejects the notions of society as an external force and obligation as a struggle between the individual and society. They also show how Bergson follows Comte in treating society as a feature of evolution that humans share with other animals but disagrees about the continuity of evolutionary progress and the perfectibility of humankind. Bergson is less sanguine about the inevitability of social progress and more concerned about the problem of war. Regarding social change, Lefebvre and White present Bergson's view that truly transformative change is catalyzed by exceptional individuals whose actions are motivated by love. They offer a succinct yet forceful presentation of Bergson's distinction between two tendencies in society, the closed and the open, highlighting his view that social pressure and the appeal of love for humanity are both expressions of life. By making Bergson's relevance to social theory and his critical appropriation of Comte and Durkheim clear, Lefebvre and White have opened up a field of possibilities for bringing his thought to bear on contemporary theorists as well.

In his wide-ranging "Bergson and Political Theory," Richard Vernon pursues the question of what Bergson might have to offer political theorists not already familiar with his work. Regarding the history of political thought broadly, Vernon situates Bergson as a critic of Durkheim and Charles Renouvier from a perspective informed by Rousseau's concerns about the natural law tradition and the "habitual defects of reason" (157). He goes on to show how Bergson's account of obligation resists the tradition, from Plato through Rawls, of attempting to provide a rational justification for obedience to political authority, and to argue that Bergson falls more in line with the realist tradition linking St. Augustine with Pascal. What connects Bergson most to contemporary realism, for Vernon, is not his intellectual lineage so much as his skepticism about the prospects for finding a non-circular justification for liberal political values. Fortunately, rather than forcing Bergson's thought into this mold, Vernon acknowledges how his concept of open society, famously appropriated by Popper, provides a different model for understanding the tension between political and moral claims. Vernon focuses on recent debates about the relationship between particularity and universality by maintaining that Bergson's Two Sources poses challenges to three leading views: partialism, cosmopolitanism, and dualism. He provides a brief but enlightening discussion of Bergson's contributions to the discourse of human rights, and concludes by raising critical concerns about Bergson's confidence that democracy represents the institutional realization of open society. Missing is any discussion of Bergson's contribution to the theory of war, which seems important, given his goal of discovering how the human war instinct might be suppressed.

Recent scholarship on Bergson's Two Sources has taken a closer, more critical look at his distinction between open and closed society, as well as his remarks about so-called primitive peoples. Mark William Westmoreland's "Bergson, Colonialism, and Race" examines several recent approaches for coming to terms with the legacy of racism and imperialism in Bergson's work. Westmoreland identifies three different approaches to confronting this legacy: some scholars read Bergson through the lens of his influence on the Négritude movement as a resource for opposing Eurocentric conceptions of reason and civilization; others take Bergson to task for the racism apparent in his discussion of civilized and primitive peoples; and still others seek a balance between owning up to the problematic assumptions underlying this distinction, on the one hand, and acknowledging his critical stance toward essentialist and exclusionary thinking, on the other. Westmoreland gives a good indication of the complexity of the current debate between scholars like Donna Jones, who attack Bergson's philosophy as a dangerous form of racist vitalism, and Messay Kebede and Souleymane Diagne, who champion the Bergsonism of postcolonial thinkers like Léopold Senghor and Muhammed Iqbal. Westmoreland joins Alia Al-Saji in seeking to defend Bergson from unfair misrepresentations of his thought while holding him accountable for perpetuating racist stereotypes and being insufficiently critical of colonialism.

The role of mysticism in Bergson's thought continues to be the subject of debate as well. In "Bergson's Philosophy of Religion," Nils F. Schott tackles the question of how Bergson understands the specifically religious element in religion. Building on Jankélévitch's groundbreaking Henri Bergson (which he recently translated), Schott aims to show how the concept of conversion illuminates Bergson's approach to religion. He focuses on the central chapters of Two Sources, where Bergson presents static religion as life's answer to the isolating and paralyzing effects of intelligence, and dynamic religion as the expression of mystical experience and the ideal of love in action. Schott traces the concept of conversion through Bergson's corpus, up to the point where he describes a conversion of the will produced by the creative emotion of mysticism. Schott interprets this conversion as a qualitative change which, in Bergson's own case, was not a sudden illumination but a gradual process. He concludes with the interesting suggestion that Bergson's choice not to convert to Catholicism as an expression of solidarity with Jewish people signifies a conversion without the traditional trappings.

This collection is extremely thought-provoking and an excellent resource for scholars as well as students already familiar with his work. The amount of attention to The Two Sources of Morality and Religion helps to compensate for past neglect of that book, but the cost is that Bergson's earliest works receive little attention. Most of the essays enrich the reader's understanding of Bergson by approaching his work with a very specific philosophical topic or area in mind, which enables the contributors to draw interesting connections among his works. Most importantly, the essays revive or initiate conversations with a great assemblage of thinkers -- not just the usual suspects -- whose ideas may help to complete, correct, and improve on Bergson's own.