Interpreting Davidson

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Kotatko, Petr, Pagin, Peter, and Segal, Gabriel, (eds.), Interpreting Davidson, CSLI Publications, 2001, 315 pp, $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 1-57586-356-1.

Reviewed by William W. Taschek, Ohio State University


The work that Donald Davidson has produced since the publication of his original two collections, Essays on Actions and Events and Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation 1 draws out, develops and defends what are arguably among the most profound and controversial implications of his earlier work—implications often not remarked upon there or at best only hinted at. With the recent publication of Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, and the imminent publication of two additional collections, Problems of Rationality and Truth, Language, and History, this later phase of Davidson’s will be easily accessible to a wide philosophical audience for the first time. 2 There is little doubt that the appearance of these volumes will, in the near future, occasion a major reexamination and reassessment of Davidson’s philosophical contributions.

The volume here under review, Interpreting Davidson, offers an early taste of things to come. Included are 13 essays that were presented at (or are descendents of papers presented at) the 1996 Karlovy Vary symposium on Davidson’s philosophy. Also included is a new and important paper by Davidson, “Externalisms”—which is not included in any of the new collections—as well as his very helpful, thematically organized commentary on the other essays. With a few exceptions, the contributors to Interpreting Davidson focus on themes that emerge most clearly in Davidson’s latter work.

The papers by Lars Bergström, “Davidson’s Objections to Quine’s Empiricism,” and Folke Tersman,”Davidson and Quine’s Empiricism,” are both concerned to explain and evaluate the success of Davidson’s critique of Quine’s empiricism. Bergström’s primary aim is to defend Quine against various considerations Davidson offers against him—viz., his commitment to scheme/content dualism, his commitment to a proximal as opposed to distal theory of empirical content, and his commitment to treating proximal stimulations as evidence, as having a justificatory role over and above a merely causal role with respect to our perceptual beliefs. Tersman, on the other hand, offers a fairly sympathetic defense of Davidson’s critique of Quine, particularly as it concerns the proximal/distal issue. Nevertheless, Tersman argues that Davidson is mistaken in supposing that his critique succeeds in undermining the epistemic privilege that Quine’s empiricism accords to observation sentences. But it is not clear that there is in fact a serious issue between Tersman and Davidson here. Properly understood, Davidson’s views have always accorded perceptual sentences—sentences the use of which is learned in ostensive situations—a certain epistemic and “semantic” priority. If there is a disagreement with Quine on this issue, it is primarily with the assumption implicit in Quine’s various characterizations of ‘observation sentences’ that successful ostensive learning requires that learner and teacher use the same signs in response to shared occasions.

As Davison’s commentary makes clear, issues about how best to calibrate agreement and disagreement between Quine and himself are complicated. The discussion in the commentary and in “Externalisms” does a very good job of clearing up many of these tricky issues and related matters. Indeed, were a number of the authors in this volume to have had a chance to study “Externalisms” before writing their papers, I suspect their contributions would have been very different from what they are.

McDowell’s “Scheme-Content Dualism and Empiricism” is a shortened version of his contribution to The Library of Living Philosophers volume on Davidson. 3 According to McDowell, that aspect of Davidson’s rejection of the scheme/content dualism that would have us deny experience a legitimate justificatory role for our perceptual beliefs—according it instead a merely causal role—fails to do justice to the actual role of experience in empirical knowledge. Like Davidson, he accepts the idea that nothing can play the role of a reason or evidence for a belief that does not possesses propositional content. But McDowell seems to argue that if the connection between our perceptual beliefs and the world is merely causal—if, that is, it is not mediated by something that can serve as a reason for it—then we lose our sense of how our perceptual beliefs can themselves legitimately play the reason-giving role that we take to be essential to empirical knowledge. To bridge this gap, McDowell encourages us to acknowledge the existence of a new propositional attitude. Like a perceptual belief, it is fully conceptualized, but unlike belief, it seems to involve no commitment to the truth of the relevant propositional content (no subjective probability), and so is in no need of reasons or evidence. Presumably such attitudes, and their contents, derive from our causal contact with the world, but, being fully conceptualized, they are now available to play the role of reasons. But as Davidson points out, it is difficult to understand how an attitude with no subjective probability can provide epistemic reasons for a belief.

Davidson, notoriously, rejects any need for epistemic intermediaries (propositional or not) between our perceptual beliefs and the world, and so, unsurprisingly, he rejects McDowell’s proposal on this score as well. Davidson feels that in general the postulation of epistemic intermediaries makes skepticism inevitable, and it is unclear how McDowell’s proposal avoids this difficulty. McDowell—like Bergström, Tersman, and Bjørn Ramberg, in his “What Davidson Said to the Skeptic or: Anti-Representationalism, Triangulation, and the Naturalization of the Subjective”—argues as if Davidson’s principal reason for rejecting traditional empiricism is that it leads to skepticism. But while it is clear that, for Davidson, entailing skepticism is a serious mark against any theory, he never rejects a theory simply by invoking skepticism in a reductio-style argument.

Ramberg offers what he takes to be an alternative, but still Davidsonian, response to skepticism. But, as far as I can tell, apart from the role he assigns radical interpretation, it fairly nicely captures the structure of Davidson’s own actual views on these matters. Central to this response is Davidson’s prior defense of an essentially externalist and intersubjective basis for linguistic meaning and empirical content—a view which, if right, would render radical skepticism about perceptual knowledge moot. And central to Davidson’s account of empirical content is the process he calls ‘triangulation’. Roughly and in barest outline, the triangle Davidson has in mind involves the following elements. First, via perception, there are causal connections between two creatures reacting in systematic ways to some feature of the environment. Second, again via perception, there are causal connections between these creatures and their reactions. Finally, these two connections become associated when each creature correlates the relevant environmental feature with the other creature’s reactions.

Issues about how to understand the triangulation scenario and its role in Davidson’s later thinking arise not only in the essays mentioned so far, but take center stage in Peter Pagin’s paper, “Semantic Triangulation”. Davidson argues that the triangulation scenario is, in the first instance, key to understanding the very possibility of thought about an objective reality: it is a necessary (but not sufficient) condition for the emergence of propositional thought. Triangulation is also essential to our understanding of how the contents of perceptual beliefs are determined. Finally, Davidson invokes triangulation in accounting for the ostensive learning of language and in explaining how radical interpretation is possible. Pagin complains with some justice that Davidson has not always been as clear as one might like in distinguishing these various tasks, nor in explaining how they relate to each other. Davidson’s essay, “Externalisms,” however, offers a welcome corrective to this and should prove immensely useful to anyone trying to puzzle out the role this central notion plays in Davidson’s recent thinking. This is not to say that no puzzling issues remain. It is Davidson’s view that propositional thought is possible only for creatures who possess a concept of objective truth and falsity; and it is clear that he thinks that triangulation is essential to possessing such a concept. But whether or not Davidson is right about the latter matter, the claim that propositional thought requires possession of a concept of objective truth is itself a quite controversial claim, and the basis of Davidson’s commitment to it is not altogether clear. To be sure, having propositional thought requires having attitudes with objective truth conditions. What is less clear is why having attitudes with objective truth conditions requires possessing the concept of objective truth.

Pascal Engel, in his “Is Truth a Norm?”, attempts to reconcile what he takes to be a tension between Davidson’s familiar claim that many of the concepts that we use to describe and explain thought, speech, and action are irreducibly normative and his claim that truth is not a norm. But it is not altogether clear where the alleged tension lies. As Davidson points out, the concepts that he insists are normative are all psychological concepts, while truth is not a psychological concept nor does it entail one. Engel argues, however, that there is a clear and reasonable sense in which we can and must view truth as a norm of belief: beliefs are constitutively evaluable as correct or incorrect where the relevant notion of correctness is truth. But for Davidson, the normative concepts relevant to belief are those of justification and having reasons for. And while these concepts may be essentially linked to truth (perhaps like the concept of a good knife is essentially linked to sharpness) there is no reason to suppose that the concept of truth (or sharpness) is itself a normative concept.

In “Dreams and Nightmares: Conventions, Norms and Meaning in Davidson’s Philosophy of Language,” Kathrin Glüer, following Davidson’s lead, sharply criticizes discussions in the philosophy of language that would have linguistic meaning depend in essential ways on notions of convention, meaning norms, or rules of use. Though, in his commentary, Davidson “applaud[s] Glüer’s entire treatment of the nest of confusions permeating [296]” these discussions, what is at stake here is not altogether clear. If by normative notions one means notions that imply prescriptions (and this seems to be how Glüer primarily uses the notion), then many of her criticisms are apt. But this is plainly an overly narrow understanding of the normative—one, it seems to me, that fails to capture the very sense in which Davidson himself wants to insist that various psychological concepts are normative.

Stephen Neale’s “Meaning, Truth, and Ontology” is a condensed version of Chapter 2 of his book Facing Facts. 4 In it he offers an excellent overview of various elements in Davidson’s philosophy, focusing primarily on the motivation for and some of the consequences of Davidson’s rejection of facts. This rejection, as Neale points out, is based on Davidson’s deployment of a sling-shot argument. Neale presents a clear and compelling case that Davidson’s rejection of correspondence theories of truth as well as his anti-representationalism are virtually immediate consequences of his rejection of facts. Neale’s lucid discussion provides a useful corrective to some misleading moments in Ramberg’s discussion of Davidson’s anti-representationalism.

Davidson is well known for attempting to defuse the anxiety or hostility aroused by his commitment to the indeterminacy of interpretation by comparing the suggestion that there are various equally good ways of interpreting another’s words and thoughts with the fact there are also various equally good ways of measuring, say, temperature (e.g., Fahrenheit vs. centigrade). Since the latter implies no lack of objectivity about, nor is it likely to encourage any serious anti-realism with respect to, temperature, the former oughtn’t do so either. Piers Rawling’s paper, “Davidson’s Measurement-Theoretic Reduction of the Mind,” is a sustained examination and critique of this analogy. After carefully detailing the structure of the analogy, Rawlings concludes that, if taken seriously, it is incompatible with viewing beliefs, desires, and the like as causally efficacious states of the sort required by Davidson’s account of rationalizing explanation. The analogy presupposes that across interpretations there is an invariant structure or framework consisting of relata and relations. Rawling’s argument depends in part on his claim that propositional attitudes are unavailable as invariant relata, for, he claims, propositional attitudes are essentially identified by the content sentences we use to keep track of them—different sentences, different attitudes. But it is hard to see why Davidson—or anyone else attracted by the original analogy—would agree to this.

Fredrik Stjernberg’s “The Vacant Mind” is yet another contribution to the now voluminous literature on the nature of first-person authority and its compatibility (or not) with externalism. There is little new in his defense of Davidson’s compatibility thesis. Stjernberg does, however, see a lacuna in Davidson’s discussion—a lacuna that manifests itself most clearly, he thinks, in the case of the self-ascription of thoughts. If I treat myself as authoritative, if I know what I think—and know that I know this without evidence—then surely there must be an answer to the question, How do I know? Stjernberg finds no satisfactory way for Davidson to answer this question. Davidson is not sure whether the question itself is legitimate.

The remaining essays in this volume concern issues of logical form and compositionality. For all the lip service that is played to questions of logical form, few authors, if any, attempt to offer anything close to a rigorous account of this notion. Ernie Lepore and Kirk Ludwig’s interesting and ambitious paper, “What is Logical Form?” is an attempt to do just this. 5 In fact, rather than attempt a definition of logical form, they attempt to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for sameness of logical form between sentences, including sentences in different languages. Along the way, they provide a criterion for when an expression is to be counted a logical constant and use various examples from natural language (restricted quantifiers, complex demonstratives, and words like “most”, “many”, “big” and “slow”) to demonstrate the usefulness of their approach. Lepore and Ludwig define sameness of logical form in terms of interpretive truth theories. But it is unclear how we can be assured that we have an interpretive truth theory for a language unless we are confident that it assigns correct logical forms to the sentences in that language.

In “By Quantifying Over Events”, Samuel Guttenplan explores a number of questions about the logical form of action sentence having the superficial form: ‘x Φ—ed by Ψ—ing’. He rejects Bennett’s suggestion that the logical forms of such sentences are best viewed as involving quantification over facts and predicating something of facts. Like Davidson, he argues that the logical forms of such sentences are best viewed as quantifying over events. He despairs, however, of finding a univocal treatment that will handle all occurrences of the ‘by’-construction. In his commentary, Davidson, surprised by this despair, suggests how he would handle the cases that trouble Guttenplan. It is not clear to me, though, whether Guttenplan would be satisfied.

Finally, in “Deflating Compositionality,” Paul Horwich argues that a satisfying account of how the semantic content of sentences depends upon the semantic properties of their unstructured constituent expressions requires no substantive semantic theorizing. He proposes what he thinks of as a deflationary approach to semantic compositionality that “involves no explication of meaning (e.g. in terms of truth conditions) and hence no explanation of why the principle of compositionality holds” [98]. To account for compositionality, Horwich proposes that we introduce names for the meanings of the primitive terms of the language. Thus, let the capitalized “MARS” name the meaning of the English expression “Mars”, and the capitalized “ROTATES” names the meaning of “rotates”—which he stipulates to be a function. (But where did this less than deflationary assumption come from?). Horwich then proposes rules of composition that tell us simply that “Mars rotates” means MARS ROTATES. But surely this can’t be right. As Davidson puts it in his commentary, “Frege may have made a mistake when he said that sentences were names, but Horwich outdoes him: for him the meaning of a sentence is named by a string of names. How can two names in a row refer to a single object?” [306].

As will be evident by now, the essays in this volume range over a wide variety of topics and are not of uniform quality. While hardly the last word on the matter, taken together they represent a useful attempt to come to terms with some of Davidson’s more mature philosophical reflections. Packaged as they are with Davidson’s very welcome essay, “Externalisms” and his helpful commentary, Interpreting Davidson proves to be a useful contribution to our understanding of some of his later work.


1. New editions of each of these volumes have recently been published by Oxford University Press.

2. Davidson, Donald, Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, Oxford University Press, New York, 2001. The two other volumes are also forthcoming from Oxford University Press.

3. John McDowell, “Scheme-Content Dualism and Empiricism”, in Hahn, L.E. (ed.), The Philosophy of Donald Davidson, Open Court Press, Chicago, 1999, pp. 87-104

4. Stephan Neal, Facing Facts, Oxford University Press, New York, 2001, pp. 17-74;

5. This paper also appears in Preyer, G. and Peter, G. (eds.), Logical Form and Language, Oxford University Press, New York, 2002.