Interpreting Dilthey: Critical Essays

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Eric S. Nelson (ed.), Interpreting Dilthey: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 287pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107132993.

Reviewed by Riccardo Pozzo, University of Rome Tor Vergata


This wide-ranging, authoritative collection, edited by Eric S. Nelson, has the format of a Companion. It isn't labeled such since Wilhelm Dilthey has not yet attained the status of a canonized philosopher, perhaps due to the dearth of English translations of his writings, and even more to their intricacy. There is now, however, the landmark six-volume translation of Dilthey's major work, edited by Rudolf Makkreel and Frithjof Rodi (Princeton University Press, 1989-2019).[1]

Given the translation, this collection may well turn attention to Dilthey's work. This may happen soon given the emerging perception that philosophy is about both research and innovation, for Dilthey was indeed the author of quite well constructed and well pursued innovative philosophical strategies. Although it dates back to the turn of the twentieth century, Dilthey's work remains enormously relevant to current debates about science policy, art and literature, the biographical and autobiographical self, knowledge, language, science, culture, history, society, psychology, and the embodied self.

In "Introduction: Wilhelm Dilthey in Context," Nelson notes that to read Dilthey's writings "in the present interpretative moment is to arrive at a configuration of thought that calls for being understood on its own terms." We are talking about a hermeneutical task, for we inevitably interpret Dilthey from our own hermeneutical situation in response to present needs and questions (p. 5). First and foremost, take the accepted view that the humanities and the natural sciences have two distinct cultures, then consider that Dilthey is said to have helped solidify the divide between these two cultures or styles of thinking. This was achieved by distinguishing between understanding (Verstehen) and explaining (Erklären) as the leading sensibilities of the subjectively and inter-subjectively oriented human sciences and the objectively oriented natural sciences. Yet, argues Nelson, "Dilthey is a problematic source for arguments for dualism given his rejection of two world theories." Instead, one ought to realize that it is "erroneous to identify Dilthey's philosophy of the sciences with the human and historical sciences alone," because for him "all sciences as practical pursuits presuppose a natural and social-historical world" (p. 11).

The first part of the volume focuses on the triad of Life, Hermeneutics, and Science. Rudolf A. Makkreel begins by remarking how ironic it is that Dilthey, "whose main intellectual purpose was to interpret other thinkers in particular and historical life in general, should be so widely misinterpreted," particularly when he is pictured as a dualist "who accepts nature as a nomothetic domain and thinks of historical reality as a spiritual sphere that can be merely described idiographically" (p. 21-22). Another repeated misinterpretation of Dilthey is that he is a relativist because he apparently embraced his own typology of changing world-views (p. 22-23). To straighten out these misinterpretations, Makkreel points out that Dilthey's concept of a productive nexus draws its original inspiration from Kant's notion of an immanent purposive system. But by broadening purposive systems into productive systems that also include more basic social and cultural functions that are valued in human life without necessarily having a practical goal, Dilthey is also able to apply them to the forms of historical life that Herder had found in native peoples. Dilthey distances himself from both traditional metaphysics and objective realism. Based on the model of the subjective immanent purposive contexts of human experience, he outlines purposive historical contexts that are objective. He calls them "cultural systems" (GS 1: 49-64/SW 1: 99-114), for they apply -- concludes Makkreel -- to a whole range of social and political interactions in which human beings engage (p. 31).

Understanding the human sciences, what they are and what they can achieve, is a compelling task today, a task as important now as it was when Dilthey was alive. This is, first and foremost, because a number of reductive approaches to the human sciences have attracted attention in the decades since the turn of the millennium. In fact, Dilthey's efforts to provide a comprehensive philosophical foundation for the human sciences were provoked by attempts to undermine the independence of historical research itself. His program of defending the autonomy of what he called the World of Human Spirit against positivistic approaches is still a paradigm for current assessments of humanistic research, which ought always to be reinterpreted and whose autonomy ought always to be preserved. We should keep in mind, however, that Dilthey is not obtusely averse to positivism. True, he wants to overcome it, but he also wants to treasure its empiricism, its attention to phenomena, e.g., in empirical psychology, which he uses to break up the speculative element of idealistic philosophy.

If we look at the average distribution of grants allocated by the European Research Council (since its foundation in 2008), we see that Physics and Engineering, the physical object, receive almost half of the pie (45%), followed by the Life Sciences, the living object, which take two thirds of the remaining half (37%) and by the Social Sciences and Humanities, which must satisfy themselves with the remaining sixth (18%). It is imaginable that Dilthey would not have lost time in stressing to policy-makers that the role played by the Geisteswissenschaften -- his denomination for what we today call the sciences dealing with the social object -- is worth more than a thin slice of the pie (which in many countries and institution is typically much thinner than one sixth). As Makkreel puts it:

the human sciences include the humanities that focus on activities associated with education and edification by means of the arts and literature, music and religion, as well as philosophical fields such as aesthetics and ethics. But the human sciences are not restricted to the humanities or liberal arts. As Dilthey conceives the human sciences, they also encompass social sciences such as political theory, sociology, and economics. Moreover, to connect these diverse disciplines, we need to understand the patterns and norms of human behavior that psychology, history, and philosophical anthropology can disclose. (p. 33)

Reconsidering the role of biology in Dilthey's philosophy of the human sciences, Jos de Mul explains how far Dilthey's notion of life as an "immanent purposiveness of organic life" can be seen as a transformation of Kant's subjectivist approach to purposiveness. In The Rise of Hermeneutics (1900), Dilthey calls biology a third class of science, one between the natural sciences and the human sciences (p. 41, see GS 6: 125). It is a distinction Kant hardly knew about, since it dates back only to 1802 (thanks to Treviranus). For Dilthey, biology takes up a mediating role which made it possible for him to anticipate contemporary naturalized phenomenological accounts of cognition as embodied, embedded, enacted, and extended experience (p. 54). Dilthey is the first to think about interpreting the connection between social-historical reality in relation to and beyond biological life. He even used the word biological turn. His "naturalized phenomenology," concludes de Mul, "can be regarded as a forerunner of present approaches in the embodied cognition tradition" (p. 60).

Tracking down the development of Dilthey's concern with hermeneutics as the practice and theory of interpretation, Michael N. Forster considers Dilthey's interest in issues of biographical and autobiographical understanding, evident in his Life of Schleiermacher (1870) and the foundations and methodology of the human sciences in the Introduction to the Human Sciences (1883). Both of these are seminal texts for Dilthey's later approaches to the hermeneutics of historical life as well as for contemporary hermeneutics. Forster makes it clear that if it is true that Dilthey was important for hermeneutics, it is also true that the distribution of his achievements and failures is surprising (p. 81).

In the context of Dilthey's project of a Critique of Historical Reason (1910), Charles Bambach analyzes a crucial moment of the "hermeneutical turn" in Western philosophy and a residue of Cartesian-Kantian metaphysical foundationalism. Dilthey appears either to paradoxically combine both tendencies or to suggest an alternative in grounding the human sciences in a historically situated self-reflexive awareness (p. 86), which he termed Innewerden in as far as it is immediate and not given relatively like an external object, namely, "that which I experience in myself" in as far as "it is present for me as a fact of consciousness because I am reflexively aware of it [weil ich desselben innewerde]: a fact of consciousness is precisely what I possess in reflexive awareness [dessen ich innwerde]" (GS 1: 134/SW 1: 227-228).

Historicism is the subject of Frederick C. Beiser's paper. Dilthey presents his project of a critique of historical reason as an extension of the historical spirit into philosophy and as a defense of the insights of the historical school (associated with Dilthey's own teachers, Ranke, Mommsen, Boeckh, and Trendelenburg) that broke with its absorption with the particular and lack of abstraction and theory. Dilthey never wrote a sustained and systematic response to anti-historicism against Schopenhauer and Nietzsche (p. 104), but he complained that both of them began with observations about personal experience and then rushed to broad generalizations for which they did not have sufficient evidence (GS 15: 67; GS 16: 361; GS 8: 162). Beiser explains how Dilthey's historical and epistemic works are aimed at a historicization of both philosophy and rationality. The nucleus of Dilthey's objection to Schopenhauer and Nietzsche is that when they formulated their own metaphysical theories, they did so without applying any of what Francis Bacon called axiomata media, i.e., maxims telling us how to find other phenomena resembling our original observations. In sum, Dilthey requires we make sure that our original observation is not an isolated case, so that we can be sure to have a broad base of phenomena as evidence of for our generalization (p. 119).

Robert C. Scharff revisits the question of the distinction between natural and human sciences while exploring Dilthey's contextualization and methodologically pluralistic alternative to the idea that scientific theory and practice require one fundamental method in order to count as scientific. Scharff argues that the real question Dilthey can help us raise is ultimately not an epistemic one concerning Verstehen and its scientific status, nor is it an ontological one concerning social as opposed to physical or living objects. It is instead a question about how we should understand the very idea of expressing or articulating human experience at all, scientifically or otherwise, and how to analyze this idea. Scharff suggests that Verstehen and Erklären are better conceived as different expressions of our manifold powers or relating to our sociohistorical engagements (p. 121). At issue is not to determine what method to follow or what regional ontology to embrace, but rather how to be an interpreter of science -- namely, the question expressed by Scharff of who we take ourselves to be as philosophers when we address such issues (p. 121). In this sense, Dilthey prefigures current science and technology studies, which in a number of significant ways have yet to sufficiently take into account the hermeneutical turn.

The second part of the volume is dedicated to Dilthey's specific contributions to Practical Philosophy, Aesthetics, and Interpretation. Shaun Gallagher looks into Dilthey's distinctive and underappreciated conception of empathy, noting that Dilthey did not use Einfühlung, but used instead mitfühlen, literally "feeling with," which has significant hermeneutical implications for Dilthey's own interpretation of the methods and practices of the human sciences (p. 147). Relying on the developmental psychology of his time, Dilthey differentiated forms of elementary and full empathic understanding and described the social mediation of the mind.

Benjamin Crowe reminds us that Dilthey's ethics addresses areas of practical philosophy such as moral development and psychology, moral education and self-cultivation, forms of practical logic and reasoning, as well as value theory (p. 159). Dilthey articulated an ethical discourse that analyzed the social-historical mediation and the priority of creativity and individuality in self-cultivation and self-formation (Bildung):

I call the laying of the foundation which philosophy must carry out self-reflection and not theory of knowledge. Self-reflection (Selbstbesinnung) provides the foundation not only for thinking and knowing but also for action. This must not be understood to mean that action could be an object of knowledge the same way a fact is, especially the facts of nature. . . . The reason for the fact that it contains more than so far has been taken into account is that statements concerning feeling and will, which involve the consciousness of what is peculiar to feeling and will, have not been adequately distinguished from knowledge in the sense of thought contained in experience and directed to its correlate, reality. (GS 19: 89/SW 1: 278)

Crowe points out that it is our self-reflection, then, that investigates the origin and rules in human "emotional life" (GS 1: 98/SW 1: 147).

Dilthey's philosophy of world-views (Weltanschauungen) is considered by Nicolas de Warren, beginning with an analysis of the dream pursued by Dilthey as it was expressed in a lecture on the historical influence of his work given on his seventieth birthday in 1903. Dilthey argues for a Philosophy of Philosophy that accepts no claim in isolation and no striving in its immediacy (GS 8: 229). This means that all theoretical and practical positions must be justified and related to a reflective context that allows no special discipline a final say. Dilthey conceives philosophy as operations and confrontations with society. His philosophy of philosophy is a means of reorganizing knowledge for society, a non-transcendental (historical) form of the critical division of intellectual labor. Disciplinary boundaries can always be questioned for the sake of a more encompassing perspective. But world-views are effective only if they bring the conceptualizing and generalizing tendencies of philosophy in relation to the concrete needs of life that find their expression in religious and cultural practices and in the arts and literature.

Dilthey is a philosopher who had much to say on cultural issues. Kristin Gjesdal examines his reception of new artistic movements represented by authors such as Dickens, Balzac, Zola, and Ibsen. In fact, Dilthey appreciated his contemporary realistic novelists and helped articulate the new poetics that these artists demanded. Gjesdal suggests that in the 1880s Dilthey's aesthetics is focused on (1) an effort to shed light on the new literary forms of realism and naturalism, and (2) a systematic attempt at grounding aesthetics in a de-transcendentalized psychology, and (3) the claim that work-oriented and systematic approaches are both needed in aesthetics.

Paul Guyer contrasts Dilthey and Santayana, looking into their respective endeavors to free aesthetic experience and practice from the demands of metaphysics and from a teleological conception of the development of art while retaining a sense of aesthetic holism. Guyer notes, in particular, that Dilthey's and Santayana's pluralistic approach never sees the sensuous side of beauty in art as a limitation. They are therefore under no pressure to regard art as a thing of the past. Guyer concludes that the culminating source of aesthetic pleasure for both Dilthey and Santayana lies precisely in "awakening and vivifying our slumbering feelings" (p. 233).

The presence of Dilthey's hermeneutics in the work of Wittgenstein is contrasted by Lee Braver by analyzing affinities and differences between Dilthey and the later Wittgenstein on issues such as understanding, interpretation and meaning-holism. Both Dilthey and Wittgenstein seem to suggest analogous ways of articulating the immanent holistic context of the life-nexus (Lebenszusammenhang) and form of life (Lebensform) through which understanding occurs, and which we cannot transcend to arrive at any unconditional and eternal foundations.

In the final paper, Jean Grondin considers Dilthey's reception by twentieth-century philosophical hermeneutics. He points out that Dilthey did not systematically prioritize hermeneutics, and did not even take it up for long periods. Nonetheless, he broadened and extended hermeneutics from an auxiliary discipline to a way of doing philosophy on its own, as testified by the continuation of his endeavor in the works of Heidegger and Gadamer, who both adopted, and polemicized against, Dilthey's interpretation of interpretation and his hermeneutical strategies.

On the whole, this volume makes clear that Dilthey conceived his program of a Critique of Historical Reason as the search for the life conditions that make possible the understanding of intellectual and socio-cultural developments on the basis of the situatedness of the human beings that first produced and experienced them. His approach is open-ended and exemplary in the ways it appropriated and gave new life to traditional concepts by recontextualizing them. Dilthey reminds us that culture is about people that take part in the project of constructing a society that ought to be less unequal, less unjust, less segregating, and less passive with regard to differing starting environments. Today, researchers in the human sciences delve into social objects, be they material or immaterial, but always set by a person, which makes a repositioning with regard to technological development more and more urgent. Persons are not there only to make sure machines work. They should engage the moral questions a human being finds while on the via humanitatis.

[1] I shall use GS to refer to the original edition of Wilhelm Dilthey's Gesammelte Schriften, Stuttgart/Göttingen: Teubner/Vandenhoeck and Ruprecht, 1914-2006, and SW for the English translation Selected Works, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1989-2019.