Interpreting Heidegger: Critical Essays

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Daniel O. Dahlstrom (ed.), Interpreting Heidegger: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 301pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521764940.

Reviewed by Theodore Kisiel, Northern Illinois University


Editor Dan Dahlstrom is quick to place this entire collection of "critical essays" under the Dilthey-Heideggerian preconception of the pan-hermeneutic character of human life: Das Leben selbst legt sich aus: "Life itself lays itself out, interprets itself, articulates itself." Aristotle's definition of humans as talking animals readily slips into our being "interpreting animals" irrevocably caught up in an interpretive process with "every move we make," thereby "elaborating, exposing, and shaping our self-understanding and, in the process, our relationships to ourselves, our world, and other things within the world." Moreover, having been thrown into this interpretive process of life willy-nilly, "our interpretations are not ours alone, but the often mindless yet time-tested iteration of a tradition of interpretations written into our most common practices and beliefs" (p. 1). The need for more thoughtful interpretations of this tradition of interpretations readily develops into some of the larger tasks assumed in the Heideggerian opus, like the need to interpret the entire history of Western thinking from its Greek beginnings to the present in order to come to terms with the "hermeneutic situation" of the revolutionary age in which we now find ourselves.

The essays are grouped into three divisions: I. Interpreting Heidegger's Philosophy; II. Interpreting Heidegger's Interpretations; III. Interpreting Heidegger's Critics.

I. Interpreting Heidegger's Philosophy

Holger Zaborowski extends the pan-hermeneutic of human life to all of Heidegger's philosophy and thought, from the hermeneutics of facticity indigenous to human life to the more transcendental hermeneutics of self-interpreting Dasein to the later hermeneutics of (and first from) the propriating event (Er-eignis) of be-ing, which is explicated by way of seynsgeschichtliches Denken, thinking in accord with the history of be-ing. Its hermeneutic finds its focus in being responsive to, listening to, hearing and saying the word/call of/from be-ing proper to its time.

Tom Sheehan takes a similar tack in his essay entitled "Facticity and Ereignis," except that his entire essay is placed under the hermeneutic-phenomenological reduction of being to meaning and its constituting source in the disclosure of meaning to human understanding. But what lets meaning come about at all? What is the constituting source of meaning as such? The answer: das Ereignis, the ever-latent 'event' of the appropriation of the human being to the meaning-giving process. "Appropriation, the thrown-together-ness of man and meaning, is the origin of intelligibility as such. It is the ultimate factum … what Heidegger calls facticity" (p. 54), behind which, as Dilthey put it, thought can go no further. Hardly a brute fact, in view of its being charged with meaning, but it does constitute a limit to our understanding. "Everything is understandable except the reason why everything is understandable" (58). The groundless facticity of the ever-latent Ereignis in its meaning-giving is thus the ultimate mystery of our be-ing.

Charles Guignon's essay on "Heidegger's Concept of Freedom, 1927-1930" picks up some of these hermeneutic strands (91f.) insofar as freedom is the leeway of free play (Spielraum) granted by the meaningful context of a historical world that opens up a range of possibilities from which a Dasein chooses and, by way of binding commitment, strives to develop in an effort to fulfill its own unique meaning of be-ing, its raison d'être. This also highlights the two temporal dimensions of meaning, namely, pregiven context and direction taken, that Heidegger himself distinguishes in his now 'classic' -- but typically mistranslated -- statement of the meaning of meaning: "Meaning (Sinn) is the toward-which (das Woraufhin), [pre]structured by prepossession, preview, and preconception, of the project on the basis of which something becomes understandable as something" (SZ 151).

Iain Thomson's essay on "Ontotheology," which is the later Heidegger's comprehensive characterization of any metaphysics, examines the onto-theo-logical structure of the "epochal constellations of intelligibility," especially in the early Greek beginnings of metaphysics and at its end or completion in Nietzsche. Each metaphysical epoch grasps reality at once ontologically (what things are, viewed from the inside-out, fundamentally) and theologically (how things are, viewed from the outside-in, ultimately). The early Greeks began ontologically with water as the one element from which all else is composed (Thales) and theologically with Anaximander's apeiron (the indefinite, infinite) as the source of all finite things. Nietzsche's ontology resides in the will to power of all things and his theology in the eternal recurrence of the same. But the attempt to extend this Nietzschean ontotheology of eternally recurring will-to-power to our present epoch of global technology is not completely satisfying, since it does not adequately account for this phenomenon issuing from the modern epoch in its entirety. Heidegger characterizes this constellation of intelligibility with the single hyphenated word Ge-Stell, which is best translated etymologically from its Greek and Latin roots as "syn-thetic com-posit[ion]ing," which presciently portends the internetted World Wide Web with its virtual infinity of websites, Global Positioning Systems, interlocking air traffic control grids, worldwide weather mapping, etc., all of which are structured by the complex programming based on the computerized and ultimately simple Leibnizian binary-digital logic generating an infinite number of combinations of the posit (1) and non-posit (0).

In a final essay included in this division, Simon Critchley explicates Heidegger's concept of ontological guilt as a debt or debit of existence rather than moral culpability, a lack or shortfall ever in need to be made up, of Dasein constantly lagging behind its possibilities, debit as an enduring way of be-ing. In sizing up its ultimately strange situation of be-ing, Dasein finds itself taut between two nothings, the nothing of being thrown into the world willy-nilly and the nothing of being projected into a life that inevitably ends in death. In the end, I owe it first to myself to own up to this double nullity inherent in human be-ing by becoming fully responsive to and responsible for this life that is most my own, ready to live it in its angst-full tension taut between the double shortfall of my birth and my ownmost death.

II. Interpreting Heidegger's Interpretations

Heidegger's interpretations of other thinkers and poets are notorious for their unorthodoxy and even violence. There are at least two reasons for this. First, in interpreting poets and other thinkers, Heidegger assumes that they partake at some level in the horizon of the originary hermeneutics of human life that is the starting point and goal of all of his interpretations. Second, his deconstructive interpretations of others' interpretations by and large tend to situate them within the history of the trend of interpretations of the Occidental tradition that he takes to be a Seynsgeschichte. Indeed, in the opening essay of this division, Dahlstrom illustrates how both of these dimensions come into play in Heidegger's interpretation of Heraclitus' conception of phusis. In an approach that was already announced early in Sein und Zeit,[1] Heidegger interprets Heraclitus' experience of phusis as ever-emerging self-concealment as a key to the meaning of be-ing at the beginning of Western thought. "Phusis is at once (diachronically) the emergence from hiddenness and (synchronically) the differentiation and interplay of unhiddenness and hiddenness" (144). Dahlstrom contends that Heidegger would be dismissive of the charge of anachronism, of projecting his own experience of be-ing back into the beginning of Western thought, of antedating some current event, since this presupposes a linear and so derivative conception of time, of a denumerable past that has passed away and is now long gone. Heidegger explicitly contends that his is a plausible interpretation of Heraclitus and that this sense of be-ing at the beginning of the history of Western thought, far from being past and gone, is the inception of an event so originary in its temporality that it continues to be ours as an originary past that comes to meet us from the future and allows us to think our way into another beginning (148f.).

Josh Michael Hayes examines how Heidegger existentializes the Aristotelian texts on the passions (pathei) of the soul in order to draw his own terms on how we find ourselves (sich befinden, i.e., Befindlichkeit) inescapably moved, affected, dis-posed, dis-placed by the world in moods that range from "being composed" (in tranquility, wonder, pleasure) to "being decomposed" (in fear, angst, pain), all of which define Heidegger's "pathology of truth."

Against the charge that Heidegger forced too much of his own thought onto Kant, Stephan Käufer demonstrates how "Heidegger's Interpretation of Kant" in his 'Kantbook' develops in tandem with the writing of Being and Time, which accordingly becomes a "deeply Kantian work." This is especially evident in the early chapters of Division II, where the phenomenology of Dasein as finitely situated ex-sistence merges with a transcendental argument about the temporal conditions of existence modeled after Kant's analysis (in the A-edition of the first Critique) of the threefold synthesis in the transcendental deduction. Heidegger thereby arrives at the originary temporality that defines the uniquely existing self, which is hardly the same as Kant's transcendental subject, which refers to any finite cognizer of objectively real representations.

Tracy Colony circumscribes an early phase in Heidegger's interpretation of Nietzsche where Nietzsche's thoughts stand in close proximity to his own task of thinking, before he eventually relegates Nietzsche to the reactive position of inverter of the entire tradition of metaphysics that marks its culmination and completion. The thoughts that Heidegger takes up as his own task are Nietzsche's witness to the death of God and to the need to prepare for the possibility of the recurrence of the divine, the need to create the conditions for a possible advent of new gods or, as it is put in the Beiträge, placing oneself at "the site of the passing of the last god."

The division concludes with Andrew Mitchell's "Heidegger's Poetics of Relationality," which examines Heidegger's postwar studies of the poetic speech of three poets in order to come to an understanding of the relation between being and language that such speech exposes. Rainer Maria Rilke's poetizing in the era of the completion of metaphysics, in particular Nietzsche's, whose language is therefore still contaminated with the logistics of the subject and object, provides a study in sharp contrast with the more poetic language of "song" that Rilke struggles to introduce. "Song does not represent something itself, it is that thing itself. Song is not a way of controlling the world, of manipulating it with tools (language). Instead, song is a way of receiving from the world … and letting things appear" (221). But metaphysics eventually wins out with Rilke's name for the field of relations, namely, "the Open," wherein things are understood to exist infinitely through poetic speech, i.e., to exist in full presence and in perfect belonging to the world (as represented by the figure of the Angel).

What is lacking in Rilke is accordingly a sense of human finitude, a sense of not belonging perfectly in the world and of presabsence, which will be provided by Georg Trakl. Trakl's figure of the wanderer immediately conveys a sense of being ever unsettled as well as being ever exposed to the limits of finitude, which exposure is always an opening onto a beyond. The limit occurs as a site of contact and relation between what is one's own and what lies beyond, opening a space of tension between the within and the beyond in a finite world of relations ever underway. "The human, the things, and language are all set in motion and stripped of any pretension to presence. This being underway is the only belonging we know" (226). An ultimate sense of finitude comes from Stefan George's poem "The Word": "And so sadly I learned the renunciation: No thing may be where the word fails." This humbling experience makes the poet beholden to the power of the word, which "first bestows presence, i.e., be-ing, wherein something appears as a being" (227). It is the word that first lets things be, the word itself is the wherein of a thing's appearance: "the word 'would be' itself that which holds and bears the thing as thing, would be as this bearing: the relationship itself" (229), indeed "the relationship of all relationships;" "the word lets the thing be because the word provides the medium through which its differentiating articulation can appear" (230). Since they only appear in the medium of a language, things themselves are from the start relational and contextual. Moreover, all that appears in this medium does so meaningfully. "Meaning occurs through the connections and relations made possible by the medium of language" (230). With the hitherto implicit dimension of language/speech as milieu of meaning now explicitly in place, we have finally come full circle in our explication of the hermeneutics of factic life experience.

III. Interpreting Heidegger's Critics

Lee Braver provides a history of analytic philosophy's reactions to Heidegger beginning with the young Gilbert Ryle's relatively positive review of Sein und Zeit in Mind in 1929. The most curious feature of this review is that Ryle criticizes Heidegger especially on a point that he himself will make central in his classic 1949 book, The Concept of Mind. This book, much like Being and Time, begins with a parodying attack on the Cartesian model of the mind as "an inner space housing ghostly thoughts" in order to give precedence to the tacit knowledge of know-how occurring in intelligent practical interactions independent of the more theoretical know-that knowledge. Rudolf Carnap's 1931 article, "The Elimination of Metaphysics by Logical Analysis of Language," which logically dismantles "meaningless" words like the substantified "Nothing" and "pseudo-statements" like "The Nothing nothings," set the standard for decades to come for analytic philosophy's dismissal of Heidegger. Richard Rorty's efforts to promote fruitful interchange between analytic and continental philosophy, largely by devising demystified versions of Heidegger's strategy of explicating the historical backgrounds out of which the problem situations of each have developed in tandem and partial convergence, met with little success. More success in promoting this interchange is achieved by Hubert Dreyfus' critique of cognitivist artificial intelligence seeking to replicate human intelligence by way of computer programs based on formal systems of physical symbols ('1' and '0') interacting according to an overt 'known-that' set of syntactical rules. Such programs have proven to be limited and ultimately doomed to failure because human intelligence is in fact more a tacit and holistic know-how operating out of meaningful contexts and practical webs of purposes and interests that enable even a four-year-old to sort out the relevant factors necessary to interpret properly one or another problematic situation.

Wayne Froman's confrontation of Heidegger with Emmanuel Lévinas reveals distinct but complementary critiques of the entire history of Western metaphysics: for Heidegger, its identification of Being with permanent presence, for Lévinas, its reduction of otherness to sameness. But further comparisons only expose fundamental disagreements. Even the most solicitous interactions with others occur for Heidegger in the basic relatedness of being-with, which for Lévinas is a mere co-existence, a being alongside that completely misses the incomparable otherness of the Other in its elevation and destitution. For Heidegger, beings are encountered in a world, for Lévinas, subordinating my relation to an Other to world compromises this relation's ethical character. Insisting on the priority of world over beings means remaining in the context of sameness or I-ness, which Lévinas calls the paganism of the native, who revels in nature's elementals of the wind, sea, light, earth, sky and their mythical divinizations to the absolute exclusion of any alien Other.

Françoise Dastur's superb essay on "Derrida's Reading of Heidegger" takes up Derrida's multifaceted critique of Heidegger from various directions, including that of Lévinas. But the crux of the critique is that Heidegger's thought itself never fully overcomes the long tradition of the metaphysics of persistent presence that he himself identified and historically traces to its completion. The problem in the Heideggerian text is its inability to think through the ontological difference between be-ing and beings in a way that escapes equating be-ing with presence. Dastur makes the following points: Be-ing is never immediately present, never immediately appears but, as the most inapparent of phenomena, belongs to whatever does appear such as to constitute its meaning and ground (SZ 35). Be-ing is never purely and fully present because of its aletheic character of concealing that always happens with the clearing of beings. With concealment having the last word, the focus is now clearly on the difference, named by the later Heidegger as Unter-schied and Enteignis (expropriation), where be-ing itself is thought to come from the difference. But Derrida still retains the edge in the dispelling of presence. With his word "différance," he becomes the thinker of the absence of presence, of a presence indefinitely deferred in the play of infinite substitutions of the world-play, whereas Heidegger remains the thinker of the presence of absence, of unconcealment arising from a concealment ever in withdrawal.

By and large, this is an excellent collection of masterly written essays all more or less tied to one of the most deeply seated threads coursing through all of Heidegger's thought, but, for that very reason, one that is quite often overlooked.

[1] "We understand this task [of the history of be-ing] to be one in which, by taking the question of be-ing as our guideline, we deconstruct the traditional content of ancient ontology until we arrive at the original experiences in which the first and subsequently guiding determinations of be-ing were obtained" (SZ 22).