Interpreting J.L. Austin: Critical Essays

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Savas L. Tsohatzidis (ed.), Interpreting J.L. Austin: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 238 pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316421840.

Reviewed by María de Ponte, University of Seville


J.L. Austin was one of the most prominent philosophers of the 20th century, and his influence in subsequent philosophy was, and continues to be, decisive. In many ways, however, the received picture of his philosophy is somewhat simplistic and oftentimes misleading. This simplification comes, I believe, in two forms. On the one hand, Austin's views are sometimes presented as historically relevant, but philosophically obsolete. Take speech act theory, for example. No one would deny the importance of Austin's insights and his decisive role as founder of the theory. Many, however, seem to consider that the subsequent developments in the theory have surpassed Austin's initial considerations, making them historically, but not philosophically significant.

On the other hand, the received picture fails to capture the wide variety of topics Austin worked on. Thus, we all think of Austin as the leading figure in ordinary language philosophy and the founder of speech act theory, but, although these two features are certainly true, his range of interests and influence is much broader. Austin's contributions are key to a range of topics such as truth, perception, action, freedom, knowledge, and speech acts. His influence remains critical in, at least, the following disciplines: philosophy of language and linguistics, philosophy of action, ethics, philosophy of law, philosophy of mind and epistemology.

This volume is an important contribution toward the mending of this simplistic picture, in its two aspects. First, all the essays present new and lively discussions of Austin's works and ideas, critically examining them and bringing them into current debates about truth, knowledge and knowledge-claims, skepticism, silencing and uptake, situation semantics, etc. Second, I think one of the volume's main strengths is the scope of topics and areas it touches, covering most, if not all, areas of Austin's work.

The book thus is not meant to be an introduction to Austin's philosophy or a historical revision of his main theses. On the contrary, each essay is meant to present novel contributions on the problems it deals with, highlighting Austin's contributions in a novel and critical way. I believe it succeeds in doing so. The editorial work is very good, with an extensive index and a very helpful bibliography. It would have been nice though to have a longer and more elaborate introduction, maybe incorporating a brief presentation of Austin's work, life and influence.

The volume could be divided, roughly, into three parts. The first part is devoted to discussion of Austin's notion of truth. This is the shortest part, comprising only one chapter, but discussion about semantics and truth are also present in one way or another in the second part, which deals with speech act theory (chapters 2-6). The third and last part focuses on Austin's views on perception, as presented in Sense and Sensibilia (chapters 7-8), and on theory of knowledge, as presented, in particular, in "Other minds" (chapters 9-10). Many new ideas are presented and argued for. The reader will gain a much better understanding not only of Austin's philosophy, but also of the wide array of topics treated. Besides, the volume manages to keep a difficult equilibrium between the exposition of Austin's ideas and their historical roots (discussing, for instance, Berkeley, Reinach, or Wilson) and their influence on and relation to today's philosophical discussions (discussing, for instance, François Recanati, Stephen Neale, or Miranda Fricker).

The book opens with "Exploring Austin's Galaxy: Searching for Truth through the Lens of Ordinary Language," an essay by Marga Reimer on Austin's notion of truth. It begins with a well-known quote from Austin, where he claims that "the statements fit the facts always more or less loosely, in different ways on different occasions for different intents and purposes." Following this lead, and without adhering to any particular theory of truth, Reimer offers a compelling defense of truth as a "spectral" notion or a "more or less" phenomenon. To do so, she argues against Strawson, Searle and Neale who, in different ways, claim that "correspondence" or "fit" to the facts, as understood by Austin, are just "empty metaphors." Reimer, following Austin, focuses on ordinary uses of the word "truth" and "fact" and claims that rather than asking for the "nature" of the concept of truth, what "needs discussing is rather the use, or certain uses, of the word 'true'" (Austin 1979: 117). I tend to agree with Austin in this respect, and I think Reimer's arguments are very compelling. Indeed, I would have liked to read a bit more on Reimer's view on facts. I think it is a key element in her defense of Austin's notion of truth and I found the ontological claims in the paper a bit too sketchy.

In "Levels of Linguistic Acts and the Semantics of Saying and Quoting", Friederike Moltmann presents an interesting interpretation of the notion of rhetic act, one that, she claims, is "extremely well reflected in the semantics of natural language" (34). Moltmann claims that the Austinian difference between rhetic and illocutionary acts is not only relevant (pace Searle) but also semantically indispensable. In this sense, she brings to the table the importance of some distinctions Austin introduced in How to Do Things with Words not only to formal semantics, but also to various forms of quotation and to the interpretation of speech acts in general. In this respect, Moltmann proposes a semantics of verbs and quotation in accordance with a "more general act-related semantic theory of sentences and of attitude reports" (35).

Moltmann briefly introduces an idea that she has been defending for some time now (Moltmann, 2013): That speech acts and attitude reports should not be seen as standing for (abstract) propositions, but rather as standing for different types of products (Twardowski, 1912) of the acts and attitudes they describe. I find this idea particularly attractive and it would be nice to read more about it in relation to Austin's speech acts.

In "On the Representation of Form and Function: Imperative Sentences", Robert Fiengo develops a detailed and interesting critique of Searle's idea of an "illocutionary force indicator." According to Fiengo, there are no such indicators and, what is more, by taking an Austinian approach, that is, by distinguishing the sentential structure from its use, we might understand why certain structures are better equipped to fulfill certain functions or purposes. To illustrate this, he focuses on imperative sentences, pointing to their characteristic lack of tense. This is a key structural characteristic, which differentiates them from indicatives and which explains why imperative sentences can only describe types of activities, and not token activities. I very much enjoyed this paper, and it is worth mentioning the initial exposition of the Fregean notion of judgement and statements, which I found very clear and informative.

In "Uptake in Action", Maximilian de Gaynesford offers an insightful contribution to the discussion on the role of the Austinian idea of "uptake" as a necessary condition on performing illocutionary acts, and the notion of "silencing", when this condition is not met. As he acknowledges, this is an exciting area of research, one in which an apparently innocuous idea about how language works (Austinian notion of uptake) can have social, legal and political consequences. Gaynesford argues against three of the main critics of what he calls the "Austinian analysis": Fricker, Ishani Maitra and Nancy Bauer. He proposes a revised version of the analysis, where he takes into consideration uptake-dependent illocutionary acts, and concludes this short but informative essay with a few very interesting considerations on poetry.

"Performativity and the 'True/False Fetish'", by Savas L. Tsohatzidis, is a critical analysis of one of Austin's most disputed theses: the claim that explicit performatives are not truth-evaluable. This thesis has been rejected by the majority of philosophers after Austin because, it is believed, if it were true it would entail that explicit performatives have no semantic content whatsoever. Besides, Austin fails to give serious arguments for the alleged lack of truth-value of these types of utterances. Tsohatzidis attempts to fill this gap, developing arguments in favor of Austin's thesis. Briefly put, he argues against the commonly accepted claim that only by admitting that they are truth-evaluable can we explain how explicit performatives achieve what they name. He does so by discussing the behavior of explicit performatives in deductive inferential contexts.

The nature of explicit performatives, their main features, differences with non-explicit or primary performatives, etc. are key issues in Austin's speech act theory.

Tsohatzidis's theses are novel, controversial and well argued. They are certainly a clear example of the volume's general aim: breaking with the received view of Austin's philosophy as merely historically interesting and bringing it back to the core of the philosophical discussion.

Following this trend, Sandra Laugier ("The Vulnerability of Reality: Austin, Normativity, and Excuses") reads Austin's philosophy of language in terms of current philosophy of action, language and law. In particular, she takes as a starting point the close relation between performative utterances and social normativity. She focuses on one key common aspect: the transgression of norms, as implied by Austin in his study of failures. According to Laugier, only by understanding the normative dimension of Austin's speech act theory, and its connection to philosophy of law, can we grasp "the full radicalism of Austin's philosophy of language" (119). Austin's insistence on the risk of failure of speech acts is often forgotten by current interpreters (she mentions, for instance, Recanati), but it is essential to law. Realizing this, she claims, is fundamental to appreciating in full Austin's proposal.

With the next two essays, we get into the third part of the volume, devoted to the philosophy of perception and the theory of knowledge. The first two offer very different takes on Austin's Sense and Sensibilia. In "Berkeley and Austin on the Argument from Illusion", Robert Schwartz points out some striking similarities between Berkeley and Austin with regard to the philosophy of perception and their attacks on the argument from illusion. Both authors, in particular, deny that the metaphysical and epistemological questions about perception can be answered, mainly because they rely on purely philosophical assumptions not present in common sense or in scientific enquiries about perception. In "Austin on Perception, Knowledge and Meaning", Krista Lawlor presents a clear and useful summary of Sense and Sensibilia, and highlights, among other things, Austin's positive views on what philosophical issues are and how they should be pursued. For Austin, philosophy should be based on our common sense view of the world; hence, it is essential to develop a proper account of truth, one that incorporates the particular circumstances in which the claims to be evaluated are made. In this regard, I found particularly interesting the connection Lawlor makes between Austin and situation semantics, further developed in her previous work (see, for instance, Lawlor 2013).

The last two essays turn to Austin's theory of knowledge, focusing on "Other minds" and, again, offering two different but consistent readings of it. In "Enough is Enough: Austin on Knowing", Guy Longworth emphasizes the similarities between Austin's view on knowledge and that of so-called Oxford Realism -- in particular, the fact that they take knowledge as a state of mind, and as primitive. Reading Austin against the background of Oxford Realism is the best way -- possibly the only way -- to understand Austin's elusive and challenging claims on knowledge. Longworth's paper is tremendously helpful in this regard. In "Knowledge and Knowledge-Claims: Austin and Beyond", Stephen Hetherington discusses knowledge-claims as performatives. He defends a view that he calls "knowledge practicalism", where knowledge is seen as an ability to know-how. His aim is to show that Austin's influence on contemporary epistemology "has the potential to be even more pronounced than it has been until now" (222).

The volume succeeds in showing the scope and depth of Austin's influence and is certainly a very welcome addition to the literature. It manages a nice balance among purely expository contents of Austin's ideas, historical research, and ongoing discussions and debates. Therefore, it will be of interest not only to Austin's scholars, but also to researchers interested in truth, speech acts, philosophy of law, perception and knowledge.


I am grateful to Kepa Korta and John Perry for comments and suggestions, and to the grants of the Basque Government (IT1032-16) and the Spanish Government (FFI2015-63719-P (MINECO/FEDER)) for support.


Austin, J.L., 1979. Philosophical Papers. 3rd edition.  J.O. Urmson and M. Sbisà (eds.). Oxford University Press.

Lawlor, K., 2013. Assurance: An Austinian View of Knowledge and Knowledge Claims. Oxford University Press.

Moltmann, F., 2013. Abstract Objects and the Semantics of Natural Language. Oxford University Press.

Twardowski, K., 1912. "Actions and Products: Some Remarks on the Borderline of Psychology, Grammar, and Logic." In K. Twardowski, On Actions, Products, and Other Topics in Philosophy, K. Brandl and J. Wolénski (eds.), pp. 103-132. Rodopi, 1999.