Interpreting Kant's Critiques

Placeholder book cover

Ameriks, Karl, Interpreting Kant's Critiques, Oxford, 2003, 360pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199247323.

Reviewed by Rachel Zuckert, Rice University


Interpreting Kant’s Critiques is a collection of Karl Ameriks’ previously published papers on the three Critiques, written over almost 30 years of study of Kant’s philosophy. In the extensive Introduction written for this volume, Ameriks identifies two central themes in these papers: 1. his articulation of Kant’s transcendental deduction arguments as “regressive” arguments designed to vindicate a priori principles (whether cognitive, moral, or aesthetic), on the basis of a presumption that our ordinary objective judgments (or experience “thickly” construed) are valid; and, 2. his interpretation of Kant’s transcendental idealism as a modest, but nonetheless metaphysical, doctrine (i.e., a view that there are things in themselves not identical to phenomena “from another point of view”). Ameriks also devotes considerable attention to recent trends in Kant interpretation, and proposes controversial readings of a number of Kant’s substantive claims, as, e.g., his readings of Kant’s epistemology as largely unconcerned with Cartesian skepticism, of Kant’ s moral philosophy as an “externalist” rationalism (as concerning, that is, not individual autonomy, but the autonomy of reason), and of Kant’s aesthetics as an objectivist account of aesthetic judgment.

Ameriks’ interpretive approach and claims might be termed a controversial traditionalism. His approach to Kant – both as a metaphysician and as presenting “regressive” arguments -- is traditionalist, first, in adhering to a long-standing interpretive tradition stretching back, indeed, to Kant’s earliest reception (see, e.g., pp. 7-12). Correspondingly, Ameriks argues forcefully against later, and currently popular, interpretive approaches, whether the purely epistemological readings of transcendental idealism (as concerning two “points of view” or “aspects” of objects) as proposed by Allison and Prauss (Chapters 2, 3, 5, and 8), readings of Kant’s aesthetics as promising an “exciting” new conception of intersubjectivity without objectivity, (p. 325) or those of neo-Kantian ethicists, according to whom, Ameriks writes, “autonomy is understood…as a matter of individual self-imposition (as if to be a Kantian is to make up norms for oneself like a teenager budgeting one’s own life for the first time)” (p. 278). Ameriks’ interpretation is traditionalist, too, in connecting Kant’s critical views more closely to Kant’s own tradition, i.e., German (Leibnizean) rationalism. Kant is not to be understood as a traditional, dogmatic rationalist (except, Ameriks suggests, in his moral philosophy) for Kant holds, on Ameriks’ view, that we cannot know anything “determinate” about noumena. Nonetheless, on Ameriks’ reading, Kant shares with the Leibnizean rationalists their strong valuation of a priori, and (specifically) metaphysical knowledge – whether of universal lawfulness, or of those entities or aspects of ourselves that transcend common experience – in his epistemology, moral philosophy, and even aesthetics.

Ameriks defends his controversial views very ably indeed. He provides considerable historical and textual support – from the critical and pre-critical works, as well as unpublished Reflectionen and lectures (especially the Lectures on Metaphysics) -- for his two, central interpretive claims. Thus, for example, Ameriks’ claim that Kant does not mean to refute all skepticism, but rather begins with rather robust premises (valid, objective judgments) and argues to conclusions concerning a priori principles alone (thus addressing skeptics “of reason”) is, as he argues, based squarely on Kant’s own descriptions of his critical project, paradigmatically in the Introductions to the Critique of Pure Reason. And it is reflected, too, in Kant’s beginning with the “fact of reason” in the second critique, and Kant’s definitional characterization of judgments of taste as having universal validity. Likewise, Ameriks makes a very persuasive case, including enlightening readings of Kant’s puzzling claims concerning the “circle” in Groundwork III (in chapters 6 and 9), that Kant considered transcendental idealism a metaphysical doctrine crucial for his moral philosophy, in order to assert a substantive, metaphysical claim that we are free, not mere “turnspits.”

Ameriks also provides an “error theory” to explain the interpretive trends to which he objects. Ameriks suggests that such interpreters are driven by contemporary “Wittgensteinian” philosophical views: e.g., that epistemology must address skepticism or else it is philosophically worthless; that any or all metaphysics is suspect; that transcendental, metaphysical freedom in particular is absurd (e.g., p. 98, chapter 8). Against these views, Ameriks argues, quite rightly, that there may well be philosophical arguments of real importance that do not address full-fledged skepticism, that Kant himself appears to believe that it is rather difficult to establish that metaphysical arguments or positions are unjustified, and that it is unclear, without argument, why Kant is wrong. Ameriks adduces an extremely helpful, well-known distinction in support of this last point, that between “short” and “long” arguments to idealism (chapter 5). Many attribute to Kant some sort of “short” argument to (epistemic) idealism – from the fact, for example, that all representations or experiences are experiences of ours. By contrast, Kant himself, Ameriks argues, engages in a “long” argument to idealism in the Critique of Pure Reason, i.e., provides extensive arguments concerning which particular representations must be understood as derived from our own cognitive capabilities (and how they can be so understood), and arguments that, therefore, such representations (or the objects or experience governed by them) must be understood as transcendentally ideal. As a result, Ameriks argues, Kantian restrictions upon what we may claim concerning things not governed by these specific, transcendentally ideal conditions may be less globally, or easily, established.

Ameriks takes, then, an unusual position in contemporary Kant scholarship: he attributes many of Kant’s (apparently) most unfashionable views to Kant, and takes a sympathetic stance towards them. Ameriks by no means endorses all of these views: he suggests that he himself would endorse compatibilism, and argues that Kant fails to establish transcendental freedom (in part for reasons Kant himself adumbrates – but fails to apply concerning freedom –in the Paralogisms). But he argues that Kant is quite right to worry about the metaphysics of freedom, and that Kant’s metaphysical positions concerning transcendental freedom and responsibility as attributes of the noumenal, atemporal self are coherent, if not very palatable, doctrines. Thus Ameriks practices what he preaches, eschewing “short arguments” to dismiss or read away those of Kant’s doctrines with which he disagrees, but, rather, engages in carefully reasoned investigation of Kant’s arguments.

Ameriks contends that Kant’s doctrine of “transcendental affection” (that our representations arise in part because we are “affected” by things in themselves) is the “’acid test’ of Kantian hermeneutics,” (p. 157) and it does, indeed, figure centrally in Ameriks’ metaphysical reading. Ameriks presents a strong case for reading this doctrine as a metaphysical doctrine (as it appears to be) and one that Kant can consistently assert (as it appears not to be) – no easy task, and one that I am not sure is fully accomplished here. Ameriks argues that this doctrine reflects a “basic belief,” or “immediate” commonsensical, realist “thought” that Kant does not, indeed, prove to be true, but – as part of his “starting point in common experience” -- also never calls into question. And Ameriks argues that because this doctrine is a very “indeterminate” claim, it is consistent with Kant’s critical limitations on our justified cognitive claims to “determinate” knowledge (pp.25-31).

But the long-standing objections concerning the consistency of this doctrine – and the corresponding temptation to an epistemic, rather than metaphysical, interpretation of Kant’s idealism –do not arise (only) from a prejudice against metaphysics (or, in Ameriks’ words, a “distaste for the noumenal”) or “short” arguments to idealism. These worries have strong textual support in passages like the following: “If, by merely intelligible objects we understand those things that are thought through pure categories, without any schema of sensibility, then things of this sort are impossible. For the condition of the objective use of all our concepts of understanding is merely the manner of our sensible intuition, through which objects are given to us, and, if we abstract from the latter, then the former have no relation at all to any sort of object” (A286/B342; my emphasis). Kant concludes that the concept of the noumenon is a “problematic” concept, standing for the possibility that there might be objects intuited by other forms of intellect not our own (i.e., one might say, representing another “point of view”). Ameriks’ account would be bolstered by some attention to – and explanation of how, on his view, one ought to read this sort of passage. Moreover, one might be tempted, philosophically, to think that Kant here identifies the only consistent position he may take and the reasons why he himself cannot, consistently, make even indeterminate causal and existential claims concerning noumena (as “affecting” us). On a Kantian view, we may well, as Ameriks argues, be able to “think” (problematically, but still meaningfully) about noumena and do so, importantly, in practical contexts (e.g., concerning God) (p. 23). And we certainly cannot have “determinate” knowledge of noumena. But, if claims concerning noumena have “no relation to an object,” how can they – no matter how thinkable and indeterminate they are – count as justifiable, metaphysical doctrine (i.e., knowledge)? Kant of all philosophers, it would seem, should not allow that we may endorse our “immediate,” a priori, metaphysical thoughts as true, without any license to claim that they are in “relation to an object.” Why, in other words, should this belief get an exemption from Kant’s strictures concerning the requisite justification for synthetic a priori claims?

Likewise, though I am sympathetic to Ameriks’ interpretation of Kant as engaged in “regressive” arguments (not intended to refute all skepticism), Kant’s texts are not unambiguous here. As Ameriks argues, Kant identifies the a priori as his primary concern in the critiques, and seems in general remarkably unconcerned by skepticism about empirical knowledge. And Ameriks also, rightly, emphasizes the problems that arise if one reads Kant as responding to skepticism by arguing that categorial synthesis is necessary for, and present in, any representation to which we can conjoin the “I think” (rather than solely in objective claims, as on his view). Kant famously argues in the A edition, however, that without categorial synthesis, our experience would be “less than a dream” (A112). Perhaps Kant abandoned this view concerning the conclusions of his arguments in the B edition, though one would have thought he would signal such a dramatic change in his new Preface. Moreover, as Ameriks notes, by the end of the Analytic Kant purports to have shown that any coherent (viz., temporally ordered) self-conscious experience of one’s own states already entails (for it presupposes) that one makes justifiable, objective judgments concerning external objects (pp. 18-19). Thus even if (as Ameriks suggests) the deduction argument itself should not be read as a refutation of skepticism, could not Kant’s entire argument in the Analytic be characterized (as, e.g., Guyer does and Ameriks suggests briefly that one actually could [p. 19n]) as an argument against at least the great majority of skeptical views?

As is perhaps clear from these remarks, even though the essays are, in principle, evenly divided among the critiques (5 each to the first two critiques, 3 to the third critique), the collection is weighted in favor of the first critique, both substantively and evaluatively. The three essays on the third critique are devoted, primarily, to the reconstruction of Kant’s deduction of taste as related to the “conditions” for cognition, and the essays on Kant’s moral philosophy not only concentrate on the intersection of the moral philosophy with the theoretical philosophy – i.e., freedom – but also are largely negative, comprising arguments that Kant’s attempts at a deduction of the moral law or to prove freedom or both fail. Thus, Ameriks’ approach might seem – especially to those primarily interested in the other two critiques – less sympathetic than one might desire to the possibility that Kant’s investigations of practical reason and judgment might provide fundamental insights of their own. Perhaps pure practical reason can, that is, provide an insight into our rational natures that supplements and transcends that which is provided by theoretical reason, and that does not need a theoretical warrant (except of its possibility, of course). In his final (review) essay on the practical philosophy, Ameriks suggests that, though Kant fails to prove that pure practical reason is “executively” free, it may be a “formal” free cause in its legislation of the moral law and thus may transcend theoretical reason. But the bulk of the treatment of Kant’s moral philosophy here touches only glancingly on the moral law, and is quite critical.

Ameriks’ reading of the deduction of taste – as comprising an argument that such judgments are, in fact, objective, conceptual judgments, not “subjectively universal” (despite Kant’s obsessive repetition of this very claim) – is, likewise, a controversial and (unusually for Ameriks) a strikingly reconstructive reading of this text. Ameriks helpfully recounts Ginsborg’s and Guyer’s (well-taken, I believe) textual/interpretive criticisms of his view (pp.319-323, 338-343), so I will not rehearse them here. More broadly, however, though he aims to defend Kant’s deduction of taste, Ameriks’ conceptualist, objectivist reconstruction is constrained – as he admits – by Kantian epistemology, by the view (in particular) that there can be no judgment, and certainly no universally valid judgment, that is not grounded on a(n objective) concept. Perhaps Kant’s own stated view to the contrary concerning judgments of taste ought, ultimately, to be judged wrong or incoherent. But to endorse such constraints from the beginning means, in effect, to render aesthetic judgment as cognitive judgment, and thus to foreclose the possibility that, in investigating aesthetics, Kant came to a new conception of judgment, that aesthetics might contribute something unique to Kant’s systematic philosophy.

For any student of Kant’s critical philosophy, this work merits serious, attentive reading. Ameriks provides here a perhaps unequaled orientation to the positions and approaches in contemporary Kant scholarship both Anglo-American and German (a daunting body of work and thus an impressive accomplishment itself). The collection attests to the value of Ameriks’ long devotion to Kantian philosophy and the interpretation thereof, to his analytical carefulness and sensitivity to historical context, both Kant’s and our own; his accounts of Kant’s deduction arguments are, one and all, meticulous. And, though some of these essays may be familiar to Kantian readers, reading them here, in (more or less) chronological order and together with those that are not easily available, allows one to follow Ameriks as he clarifies, broadens, and deepens his views in dialogue with others. The fruits of this long reflection are clear, too, in the Introduction and the final chapters of Part II and Part III, the most recently written portions of the book, in which Ameriks provides thoughtful, overarching accounts of the historical and continuing philosophical significance of Kant’s philosophy, as a “modest” attempt to come to terms with the dramatic transformation of natural science in modernity, and to remain true to common experience as well as to the highest aspirations, metaphysical and moral, of human beings. And, though these interpretations will not persuade all Kantians, Ameriks provides an invaluable service to Kant scholarship, a deeply and notoriously partisan field, in warning against the dangers of reconstructive distortion, and to all readers of Kant in elaborating and powerfully defending his controversial-traditionalist interpretation.