Interpreting Maimonides: Critical Essays

Placeholder book cover

Charles H. Manekin and Daniel Davies (eds.), Interpreting Maimonides: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 266pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107184190.

Reviewed by Oliver Leaman, University of Kentucky


The essays in this volume are roughly divided into three groups. Some share the position that Maimonides was not setting out to produce a list of answers to perplexing issues but rather a methodology for his readers to follow. Others seek to defend Maimonides on a variety of issues and explain how his argument on the topic is supposed to work. I was never that sure whether these chapters were really defending Maimonides or just explaining his position against its detractors. Still other essays deal with the commentators on Maimonides and either criticize or support them. A general theme is to link Maimonides the philosopher with Maimonides the everything else. This comes out nicely in the chapters by Yehuda Halper and James T. Robinson on the binding of Isaac and Jacob's ladder.

The first two chapters deal with commentators: Herbert A. Davidson criticizes Sarah Stroumsa's book on Maimonides and her attempt to link him with the Almohad regime of his time, while Y. Tzvi Langermann is far from convinced that he was influenced by al-Ghazali. The influence of influence is much to be seen in this book. The authors are interested very much in where Maimonides is supposed to have got his ideas and not so much in what those ideas are worth. The last two chapters also deal with commentators, but are more favorable to them. Josef Stern suggests that Shlomo Pines at one stage regarded Maimonides as following an Averroistic/Spinozistic strategy. This is not because Maimonides was aware of their work, He could have been aware of Averroes but Spinoza came later, and seems to have been influenced, that word again, by Maimonides. Pines' early work seems to see Maimonides as an early Kantian, regarding it as possible for us to understand how to know important things, while later on he was dubious about how far reason can take us in acquiring significant information about God. That is actually a Kantian thesis. Warren Zev Harvey looks at Leo Strauss and argues plausibly that his approach to Maimonides should not be limited to the Athens vs. Jerusalem debate. Maimonides had subtler views of the topics he was considering and instead of identifying and trying to deal with just one kind of problem he produced a range of problems as part of his effort at trying to understand what we can know about matters that are above us.

Diana Di Segni proves comprehensively that the Latin version of the Guide was available at the same time in the thirteenth century in both Paris and Northern Italy, so it did not move from the former to the latter. I am now convinced, although why anyone should be interested is another matter. So Italy was not influenced by Paris, apparently. Di Segni takes the opportunity to exhaustively establish her case. I am not sure this is really part of interpreting Maimonides, although it is worth noting his role in the Christian world in this period.

Harvey, Kenneth R. Seeskin and Sara Klein-Braslavy are in broad agreement that Maimonides was in the business of multiplying perplexities to give the thinker the opportunity to come closer to the truth by trying to resolve them. There are two issues worth raising here. One is that this looks very much like an appeal for dialectical reasoning, the style of kalam, to which Maimonides remained steadfastly opposed in his philosophical output. He saw that form of reasoning as much weaker than the sort of demonstrative variety advocated by Aristotle and regarded by Maimonides (and the Peripatetic philosophers in general) as the gold standard of how to operate intellectually. The other difficulty is that it is worth noting that perplexity is a polite word for apparent contradiction, as David Wirmer points out. Someone believes in something on religious grounds and yet intellectually cannot reconcile that with something else. As logicians know, from a contradiction anything can be validly derived, which accounts perhaps for the often rather wild claims by those who write about Maimonides and his work. These chapters are all well written and display an impressive grasp of Maimonides.

The chapter on Maimonides' discussion of the status of gentile women has him arguing that a gentile girl of three years and one day who fornicates with a Jewish man ought to be killed! Hannah Kasher explains why he argues this, believing apparently that any such incident involves leading an Israelite into a sin, for which only the most egregious punishment would be appropriate. It means the girl shares the status of an animal, and in a culture where animals are liable to be killed at the whim of human beings such a penalty is appropriate. Yet when one considers killing someone a little over three for sexual behavior, one is entering a world of horrors it is difficult to understand. Women are biologically and intellectually inferior to men, while gentiles do not share the history of Jews and their link with Abraham and Moses, and so have the wrong background to become readily perfected. Kasher explains how prominent such theories were at the time, and I am sure she is right. Yet she doesn't look at issues which arise along the way. We are told by the rabbis that Balaam is not only a prophet despite being a gentile, but that he is even greater than Moses (Numbers Rabbah xiv.20) and yet Maimonides denies this. There is no discussion of this apparent contradiction. Why does Maimonides disagree with the rabbis, and if so, on what grounds? He must have been horrified at the idea of comparing Balaam with Moses, since the latter's prophecy is unique, according to Maimonides, the very paradigm of prophecy, while Balaam not only suffers from being a gentile but also was often bad. It would be nice to know what is going on here, but we are not told. Presumably when Balaam was good he was able to prophesy, he then was in a fit state to receive prophecy, but otherwise not. Perhaps he was said to be superior to other prophets since he found it so hard to be good, and so to prophesy, and his status as a gentile is obviously for Maimonides a big hurdle here to overcome.

The chapter by Daniel Davies is a sustained discussion of the issues of knowledge and providence. According to Maimonides, divine knowledge should not regarded as just like our knowledge but more complete. God knows abstract things and when it comes down to this world of generation and corruption he knows about species but not individuals as we know them. He does not see them, for example, but on the other hand he knows how the species of human beings operates. This looks like a limitation in divine knowledge. I know what make of computer I am typing this on, but apparently God, the omniscient God, does not. The doctrine of providence to which Maimonides is also committed might regard it as important for God to know what happens in the world, since if He does not, how can He help us when we require such assistance? Davies argues plausibly that this apparent problem is not really a problem and so Maimonides should not be seen as trying to hide his real views on the issue. This is because he thought we could attract divine providence by acting in accordance with how our species ought to act, i.e. rationally. In so far as we do, God can recognize the species attempting to realize itself perfectly, as it were, and will respond. It is a rather strange idea, and before returning to providence we have to accept that for Maimonides God has no access to animals as individuals, since they have no intellects that can be perfected. This is a problem. Does He then not know of the incident where Balaam's ass spoke to him in the Torah, for example? The idea that we receive providence when we are perfecting our intellect but not otherwise is not without issues either, since presumably while I am thinking about this issue I am receiving providence, but once I go off and have a cup of tea it is withdrawn. What does that mean? Does it mean that if I have toothache then it will diminish while thinking about theoretical issues such as that of divine providence and reassert itself otherwise? That seems a rather banal idea and understanding of what divine providence really is.

Perhaps the idea is that while perfecting my intellect I will not really notice the toothache, since it only affects my body and not my mind. That works for some physical issues which are not so pressing, but not for others which affect us both physically and mentally. In the Book of Job, it was clever of Satan to attack Job's integrity in both ways, by making him lose everything and then get sick. Maimonides comments that while the Bible tells us Job was good, it does not say he was intelligent, because he thought that the material things in life are important, a delusion from which a more advanced intellect would have saved him. Once he comes to realize that, then, according to Maimonides' account, providence is received and everything turns around for him. Of course, the story of Job is taken by Maimonides to be allegorical, with an emphasis on the misleading nature of matter. If we are to attract providence we need to rise above our concern for the material aspects of our world. If there is one general criticism I have, it is that none of the contributors really represents Maimonides' view on the evil and deficient nature of matter.

Maimonides' approach to providence is a profoundly inimical theory with respect to religion as normally understood. It makes no mention of morality or religious observance, for example. These seem to have no part to play in attracting providence. It is not surprising since the Aristotelian notion of God that lies at the center of the system has no direct interest in or awareness of this world. He thinks at an abstract level and other things move around Him and develop from that, but the idea that He is concerned with the beings in this world is dubious. The only exceptions are those with perfected intellects: they are living up to the paradigm of the sort of beings they are, and so define a species. Maimonides does not spell out how distinct this idea of providence is from that normal in religion, and for good reason.

Davies says he is not concealing anything, which may well be true, but he certainly is far from frank about the radical nature of what he has established. Providence is available to a very limited group of human beings, at limited times, and we are not told what it is. Davies gives the example of stepping on broken glass and then providence kicks in by our thinking about abstract matters and coping with the pain as a result. That is not what we normally mean by providence; providence is someone helping us avoid the broken glass in the first place. In the chapter by Wirmer that follows Davies the incompatibility between the two versions of providence comes out clearly. On the one hand we have a creator deity who makes the world in a particular way, in accordance with his choice and decision. On the other hand we have an Aristotelian God who follows a plan in the sense that what flows from Him is necessary and inevitable. Does Maimonides manage to bring these two different accounts together? No, he does not, and Wirmer says frankly that this "perplexity" is in fact a contradiction.

Perhaps, though, it can be resolved by allegory. The trouble then is that we step into the esoteric/exoteric bog and it is difficult to get out. It is not surprising that Maimonides ranges over so many topics, moving from semantics, providence, creation, prophecy, miracles and so on, since if he was working with contradictions then everything he discusses is affected. Charles H. Manekin argues plausibly that Maimonides held that the Torah came from God, and Moses was merely its scribe -- hardly a controversial idea, although as he says, some suggest that Maimonides' "real" view is that Moses was its author. Along the way he discusses the Noahide issue, whether those who follow basic norms of human behavior and yet are without the Mosaic process of revelation can expect to be rewarded in the next world. He seems to say that they cannot, unless their access to the revelation is Mosaic; it is no good if they come upon these ideas in some other way.

It is not clear to me that this is really Maimonides' view, an alternative translation of the relevant passage from the Mishnah Torah suggests that gentiles can accept the Noahide laws and not Mosaic prophecy, and still be rewarded in the next world. Whatever his view, it has to be accepted that to base Noahide law on Mosaic law would be very strange indeed. One could accept that Noah is an important source of guidance without going in the direction of the whole legal system of which he is a part. In any case, it would be surprising if only Jews and those convinced of the merits of their law are rewarded after death. It does not seem fair for God to condemn some people, indeed, most people, to miss paradise because of who they are, which is after all how He created them.

Again I bring up the point that when we look at Maimonides, are we just trying to work out his arguments or are we also trying to work out whether they are valid? It seems to me that many of the contributors are only doing the former. That is a shame, since it rather restricts the interest of the work of the thinker they are discussing. Obviously we need to understand their views in the context of their times, but we can and should go on to look at how plausible their views are philosophically. As with the gentile girl of three years and one day who causes an Israelite to err, and so should be executed, this extraordinary claim does need more than just a cursory explanation. If Maimonides really thinks that the majority of humans are denied a reward in the future life basically because of who they are, then we must acknowledge his claim as really shocking. There is no shortage of significant thinkers who hold detestable views, of course; yet when they arise they do need to be acknowledged and dealt with in some way.

This disinclination of many of the contributors to examine ideas philosophically is unfortunate. The issue of providence is not just the debate between two different ideas of God, an analytical and impersonal being as opposed to a father-like and loving creator. The latter view seems to be the province of those far from the king and his throne, in Maimonides' parable, while the former is the view shared by those who are closer to him. He gives the example of a king on his throne in a palace and different courtiers having varying levels of access and proximity to the seat of power and authority. Ordinary believers seem to be on the periphery while those with a more sophisticated understanding are closer to the king. This gives rise to the idea that Maimonides has as his real view the idea that only the intellectual elite have real access to how things are, while the unsophisticated are limited to naïve and misleading images of the truth. But we do not have to go in this direction. This contrast between two kinds of God is a familiar issue in the philosophy of religion and theology, and particularly familiar to Islamic theology, but there is nothing especially mysterious about it. When we are in difficulties we often want to get support from someone who is our friend and has a personal relationship with us. At the same time, we may want someone to consider the issue from an analytical and completely objective point of view. Providence may involve both kinds of support. When things go wrong, the consequences for us appear to be arbitrary in many cases, yet given that we are material creatures they are not arbitrary at all. Something happened to set up a chain of causes and effects and these brought about something else, something that harms us. We would like God to wave a magic wand and remove the impediment, in just the way that a parent or friend would if they could. For Maimonides, this is to profoundly misunderstand the radical essence of nature as evil, as resisting God. We are in the natural world and so subject to that world, and to expect a magical remission is to fail to be rational.

According to Maimonides, that is Job's mistake; the Bible says he was good but not that he was wise. His friends compound the problem with their suggestions for how to evade nature by invoking divine assistance and grace. There is no perplexity or contradiction being hidden or revealed; it is a familiar philosophical problem in need of a solution. Maimonides has tried to solve it, and it is for us to respect his efforts by considering whether they work or otherwise. The contributors do a great job elucidating the arguments, but tend to finish at that stage, when the job is half done, as it were.