Interpreting Schelling: Critical Essays

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Lara Ostaric (ed.), Interpreting Schelling: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 256pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107018921.

Reviewed by Dalia Nassar, University of Sydney


Over the last two decades, interest in Friedrich Schelling (1775-1854) has undergone a significant renaissance, first in Germany, and more recently in the English-speaking world. A key figure in German Idealism, and a major influence on several late nineteenth century thinkers and movements, including Kierkegaard and Marx, Schelling has been, since the mid-twentieth century, the most neglected of the idealist philosophers and possibly also the least understood. Several conferences and symposia focused on his writings have been organized in the last few years, and a number of articles and essays dedicated to his work have recently appeared. While in Germany this rise of interest led to the publication of several monographs and edited collections, there are only a few books in English that specifically focus on Schelling -- the majority concern German Idealism or Romanticism and consider Schelling's contribution to either movement. For this reason, Lara Ostaric's edited volume, which is dedicated to Schelling and systematically covers his long and rich career, appears at an opportune time and fills an important lacuna in the Anglophone scholarship.

What are the reasons behind the rise of interest in Schelling's writings? There are several ways to answer this question. One would note that Schelling's writings are finally being edited in a historical-critical edition in Germany, and more and more English translations of his works are appearing. Another response would point out that Schelling is the last of the major thinkers of German Idealism to be rediscovered, so to speak, following the revival of interest in Kant in the 1960s and 1970s, Hegel and (to a lesser degree) Fichte in the 1980s and 1990s. Thus, those interested in German Idealism would be compelled, at this stage, to pursue a study of Schelling, if only for the sake of grasping his role in that movement.

But I don't think these answers fully capture the current interest in Schelling. After all, Schelling differed from his Idealist contemporaries in important ways. I will just mention the most obvious and relevant: his interest in nature. Schelling was the philosopher of nature, having established what he termed Naturphilosophie. In contrast to Fichte and Hegel, who were primarily interested in culture (in human consciousness and human creations), Schelling's work was fundamentally shaped by the attempt to speak about nature philosophically. This goal, alongside his aim to overcome mind-nature dualism, and his view that Naturphilosophie must be in dialogue not only with the natural sciences, but also with epistemology, ethics and aesthetics, make him a particularly relevant interlocutor in current discussions of the human-nature relation, and of the ways in which philosophers can and should respond to the environmental crisis.

The essays in Ostaric's volume nicely portray this interrelatedness of Schelling's thought, without overlooking shifts in his views, or underestimating important continuities in his thinking. Thus although the volume proceeds chronologically -- from Schelling's first philosophical publications in the mid 1790s, through his Identity Philosophy in the early 1800s, to his so-called "middle" period, and finally, his late lectures from the 1840s -- this does not come at the expense of a rich and nuanced account of his work or development. Many of the essays in fact gesture toward other moments in Schelling's thinking, and a number of them offer important comparative analyses between the various periods of his thought and the connections between his different philosophical interests over time -- although some of these chronologies contradict one another and an acknowledgment of these interpretive differences would have been useful. All the essays engage with the recent literature (in English and German) and, for the most part, offer clear explications of some of the most difficult topics in Schelling's writings.

In addition, the essays contextualize Schelling's thought in his time and compare him to other idealist thinkers, above all Kant and Fichte, but also Hegel. This is an advantageous strategy, especially in the current philosophical context, where the majority of readers will be more familiar with the other thinkers. There is one disadvantage to this strategy, however, and it is especially clear in the essays that compare Schelling and Kant. At times, the authors implicitly assume Kant as the standard by which to measure Schelling, and thus do not give adequate consideration to why Schelling may have diverged from Kant. The volume as a whole does not, however, suffer on account of this. Rather, it is a solid and much-needed contribution to Schelling scholarship and will surely inspire further research and interest in his work.

Eric Watkins' opening piece is a detailed account of the early Schelling's conception of the unconditioned, which aims to demonstrate that Kant (and not Spinoza or Fichte) was the main influence on Schelling's understanding of the unconditioned. Watkins' analysis is illuminating, but there were points in the discussion where further justification of the "Kantian background" would have been welcome. The difficulty concerns Schelling's claim that the unconditioned is self-causing or self-positing. As Watkins notes, the notion of a self-causing cause is one that Kant rejected (29). Yet it is at the heart of Schelling's account of the unconditioned. For Schelling the unconditioned achieves this status because its form and content are reciprocally conditioning (cause and effect of one another). While Watkins offers a compelling defense of Schelling's move to the notion of a self-causing cause (contra Dieter Henrich's objection that it is a non sequitur), in so doing, he leaves the reader wondering about the extent to which this move and thereby Schelling's conception of the unconditioned can be described as Kantian.

Michael N. Forster examines Schelling's responses to skepticism over his lifetime, which Forster divides into four main periods. Three of these periods are "inspired" by someone else's position (Fichte, Hegel, Romanticism, respectively). Schelling's final position, "Positive Philosophy," does not take skepticism as seriously as his earlier positions, Forster argues, and departs from his Romantic position insofar as it is an attempt "to escape the sort of endless series of skeptical destructions that the quasi-Romantic position had taken to be the final word about the human condition" (47). This is a rich examination of Schelling's responses to a fundamental philosophical problem, but Forster's approach implies a general lack of originality on Schelling's part. Was Schelling really so unoriginal? This is particularly striking when Forster ascribes to Hegel the view that skepticism can only be countered if thought and being rest on one fundamental principle and claims that Schelling develops this view in collaboration with Hegel in 1802-03 (42). As Watkins notes, however, this was a position that Schelling developed in the mid-1790s. Ultimately, though, the question that Forster's essay raises is this: can we learn anything from the apparent shifts in Schelling's thinking about skepticism? Could it be the case that Schelling did not arbitrarily alter his responses but came to recognize fundamental deficiencies in the various positions he adopted and later abandoned?

In "The concept of life in early Schelling," Ostaric explicates the development of Schelling's philosophy of nature, and in particular his account of life in relation to Kant's construction of matter and conception of organisms. By looking at Schelling's three major works in Naturphilosophie, she draws out an overlooked continuity in his thought, which she finds to be problematic in its reliance on intellectual intuition. The trouble, Ostaric maintains, is that for Schelling natural science is dependent on "a contingent event in human history," namely philosophical genius (69). Though she does not consider Schelling's understanding of the relationship between the philosophy of nature and natural science, or his engagement with the natural sciences, her claim is that Schelling is "caught between the Scylla of dogmatically grounding natural science on Naturphilosophie . . . and the Charybdis of conceding that science should be a body of knowledge not grounded on absolutely necessary principles" (50).

Paul Guyer contrasts Kant's and Schelling's views on knowledge and aesthetic pleasure. Guyer regrets Schelling's cognitive turn and his attempt to make art into a vehicle of knowledge because, in so doing, Schelling divests art of its free play and limits its potential for "active, positive pleasure." The problem is that for Schelling the experience of art does not result in further activity, as it does in Kant, but in "something that we passively receive rather than ourselves produce, and it does not stimulate any one -- audience or successive artists -- to activity but rather stills 'all urge to produce'" (83). This is worthy of further consideration; but is it right to pitch Kant's free play over against Schelling's cognitive account, without acknowledging that Kant gestured in the direction that Schelling took? After all, Kant's statement that "The self-sufficient beauty of nature reveals to us a technique of nature, which makes it possible to represent it as a system" (AA 5: 246) invites precisely such a cognitive turn.

Daniel Breazeale's chapter on "philosophical construction" in Schelling's Identity Philosophy explicates in great detail what Schelling intends when he employs the methodology that Kant had reserved for mathematics (i.e., construction) in philosophy. If philosophy is a pure science (as Kant had argued), then its concepts must be "constructed" non-empirically. But how can this be achieved? Breazeale takes up this difficult question, and, by comparing Schelling's answer to Fichte's and Kant's and carefully analyzing Schelling's texts, he shows that Schelling arrived at a distinctive conception of philosophy and philosophical knowledge after 1800 -- a conception in which "truth and method" are inseparable (112), such that it is only through the right method (intellectual intuition) that truth can be guaranteed. This raises a number of questions, which Breazeale nicely highlights, and illuminates Schelling's position regarding truth: truth is a creative act that is nonetheless non-subjective.

Manfred Frank similarly focuses on the Identity Philosophy, but rather than discussing method, he is interested in the meaning of identity. He argues that Schelling inherited a distinctive understanding of identity from the Tübingen logician, Gottfried Plocquet, and combined it with Kant's well-known statement that being cannot be predicated. This led Schelling to conclude, with Novalis and Hölderlin, that "the essence of absolute identity presupposes a ground that rejects all consciousness" (130). Most importantly and, I think, interestingly, Frank shows how Schelling's formulation of identity in terms of an insofar-as structure (a insofar as it is A and a insofar as it is B, such that a=A and a=B, and therefore A=B) allows him to overcome mind-body (mind-nature) dualism and shares significant features with Donald Davidson's non-materialist non-dualist account of the mind-body relation (136, 141).

Michelle Kosch offers a compelling account of Schelling's 1809 Essay on Human Freedom, which argues that the key issue in that work is not theodicy but evil. Kosch begins by placing the Essay between Schelling's earlier compatibilist account of freedom and his later non-compatibilist account. She masterfully problematizes the positions that Kant and Fichte (and the early Schelling) had taken in relation to evil and shows how Schelling sought to offer a more coherent account. The way in which Kosch frames the problem of evil in Schelling's thought is clear, fascinating, and makes important gestures toward demonstrating how Schelling can be brought to bear on questions in contemporary moral philosophy.

Contra the view that in his middle period Schelling was not interested in aesthetics, Jennifer Dobe argues that Schelling's conception of artistic creation offers a key to understanding the Freedom Essay. Positive evil, Dobe explains, has to do with a will that opposes the moral law because it is only concerned with itself rather than with what is universal. Thus a virtuous act involves limitation of the self, and, she contends, there is a parallel between this and the "the act of 'descending into form,'" which she identifies with artistic creation (170). It is not clear, however, how creating artistic form involves self-limitation and how form (which implies particularization, individuation) involves universalization. Dobe makes a note of this and explains that "in order for the universal to appear (as grace and love), there must be unity to be sure, but without the complete dissolution of individuals" (173). What then is the relation between form (individuality) and virtue in the creative act? Is the creative act, as Dobe maintains, parallel to the moral act? Her conclusion seems to imply this (178), but it is difficult to grasp given that artistic form need not be either good or evil and thus does not seem to have a clear moral parallel.

In "Nature and freedom in Schelling and Adorno," Andrew Bowie continues the examination of Schelling's conception of freedom by explicating Schelling's potential to address current debates on the relation between nature and culture, criticize various forms of reductionism, and show how reason can be just as dangerous as the most threatening aspects of nature (195). Bowie argues that a key claim in the Freedom Essay and later writings is that intelligibility is more fundamental than any particular manifestation of intelligibility (189), which in turn means that intelligibility cannot reduce itself to any one form of intelligibility ("cannot be self-grounding"), and must therefore "incorporate a sense of its historicity" in order to articulate or grasp itself (192). Insofar as nature is always understood in contrast to freedom or reason, Bowie maintains, it follows that nature too is historical and appears differently under various historical circumstances (193). Ultimately, Bowie argues, nature and freedom appear differently at different times, and depending on their relation and specific form, they can be more or less dangerous. This fascinating exploration of Schelling's thought illustrates Schelling's relevance in a number of important ways.

Günter Zöller's "Schelling's political philosophy of religion" surveys Schelling's views of the relationship between state and church. In contrast to Kant, Zöller argues, Schelling "sees the (political) state as essentially remaining within the state of nature and, therefore, turns his focus ahead of history to a kind of freedom that lies beyond the state's external ordering of freedom" (213). This has to do with "the different systematic place each of them assigns to the place of freedom" (214). For Schelling, the state is not the origin or executor of freedom, leading him to a "radical critique" of the state which "calls into question the very status of the state as an institution of right".

In the final essay, Fred Rush offers an illuminating systematic account of Schelling's critique of Hegel. Above all, Rush considers the soundness of Schelling's critique -- first articulated in his Munich lectures from the 1830s, and developed in his Berlin lectures from 1842-43 -- by assessing its viability as an internal critique of Hegel's dialectic (a critique "from within" [225]), and as a more general critique of Hegel's conception of being (226-7). It is from this latter perspective, Rush argues, that Schelling's critique becomes compelling, for it reveals that Hegel's own critique of the concept of being is based on one of two possible assumptions (227). Thus Schelling shows that "Hegel has introduced a presupposition into what is supposed to be a completely immanent set of arguments." Rush goes on to offer an excellent overview of Schelling's notions of positive and negative philosophy, concluding with a compelling question to Schelling, one that will surely leave many thinking further about these important philosophical distinctions.