Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays

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Charlie Huenemann (ed.), Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 196pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521871839.

Reviewed by Steven Barbone, San Diego State University


"Caute" ("Attention!") was how Spinoza sealed his letters, and editor and contributor Charlie Huenemann opens this anthology by reminding readers that despite Spinoza's use of the geometric method in the Ethics, Spinoza (whose name derives from the Spanish word for "thorn") must be read with care and attention to avoid the prickles many encounter in his philosophy. While not pretending to deliver the last word on some of the more thorny sticking points in Spinoza's thought, this work proposes and succeeds to offer new (not reprinted) studies to help clarify important intertwining issues in Spinoza's metaphysics, psychology, and politics. Though each contribution was written independently and may stand on its own merit, there is a certain cohesion among the essays, and the reader will discover several themes -- the meaning of "in" in Spinoza's philosophy, the possibility of free thought, and the role of the imagination especially in his political philosophy -- that reflect and respond to other essays in the collection. Because the volume includes contributions from both well established Spinoza scholars and some researchers newer to Spinoza studies, readers will also discover some refinements and clarifications of current interpretations as well as some new, original analyses.

The anthology also seems to be a Festschrift of sorts for Edwin Curley, whose interpretative translations and invaluable studies have contributed immeasurably to contemporary Spinoza studies. Every author relies on some of Curley's works, and many note his numerous contributions. Several include in their essays a kind of homage to Curley but then find themselves more arguing against one of his interpretations rather than developing or defending it. Nevertheless, Curley's important contributions often serve as a backdrop for much of the work done for this volume.

Nine essays make up the collection, and their authors and titles show the scope and breadth of the volume: Don Garrett's "Representation and Consciousness in Spinoza's Naturalistic Theory of the Imagination" [4-25], Michael Della Rocca's "Rationalism Run Amok: Representations and the Reality of Emotions in Spinoza" [26-52], Steven Nadler's "'Whatever Is, Is in God': Substance and Things in Spinoza's Metaphysics" [53-70], Michael V. Griffin's "Necessitarianism in Spinoza and Leibniz" [71-93], Charlie Huenemann's "Epistemic Autonomy in Spinoza" [94-110], Michael A. Rosenthal's "Spinoza and the Philosophy of History" [111-127], Susan James' "Democracy and the Good Life in Spinoza's Philosophy" [128-164], Tom Sorell's "Spinoza's Unstable Politics of Freedom" [147-165], and Daniel Garber's "Should Spinoza Have Published his Philosophy?" [166-187]. The broadest brushstrokes are used in what follows to provide an overall image.

Garrett's essay provides a neat reply to Margaret Wilson's worries that Spinoza's identification of any object's mind to God's idea of that object does not allow Spinoza to develop a sustainable account of mind since her reading seems to hold that every mind must be aware of all that occurs within its body, not have any knowledge of things external to the body, be conscious, and always behave in a manner that manifests mental activity. Garrett's response revolves around understanding better what Spinoza meant by ideas "being in" the mind and the nature of imagination. Details are omitted in this review, but all the problems are resolved by Garrett's explication of an incremental naturalism whereby any mind more or less is aware of all that occurs to its body, more or less knows itself through external bodies, more or less is conscious, and more or less behaves in a mindful manner. The incremental naturalism is entailed by Spinoza's monism and God's being a thinking thing.

Della Rocca explicates ideas found in his many other works. Here he especially focuses on how to link causation and inherence since although the passions, as modes, must be in something, as passions they are negations of a sort. Negations cannot cause or rightly be in something, so how is this possible? Della Rocca's use of the principle of sufficient reason locates any effect "in" its cause so any passive affect is spread out in several things (e.g., the body and some external cause) and not in any one mind (except God's even though God's mind cannot contain any passive affect). The passions, under this reading, are negative not because they are "bad" but because they don't fully exist in the person who has them, and they certainly don't exist in God as passions.

Nadler's interpretation concerning what it means that a mode should exist in God leads to a discussion of part/whole relationship. If all modes are in God, how can we account for evil (modes) in God? Pace Curley, modes are not solely causally "in" God, i.e., Spinoza's God is not merely a producer of modes but somehow both the producer and products, and evil is only a human projection. Under Nadler's reading, Spinoza's identification of God with nature is meant in the strictest and most literal sense.

For Griffin, contra both Curley’s and Bennett's influential readings, metaphysical necessitarianism in Spinoza and Leibniz need not be implausible. This essay gives an interesting comparative analysis of Spinoza's and Leibniz's metaphysics. While Spinoza's version of necessitarianism is more extrinsically causal and cannot allow for other possibilities, Leibniz's version allows for the real possibility that things could have been different had external circumstances differed.

Huenemann's contribution specifically looks at the seeming contradiction between Spinoza's deterministic metaphysics and his goal to advocate for basic autonomy or freedom for the mind's aspirations toward rational thought. Huenemann's essay -- perhaps the most interesting in terms of style -- looks for a way to make sense of the mind's ascent to the third kind of knowledge given that the mind's ability for free thinking is as limited as the body's ability for free movement. Rejecting the account that when the mind engages common notions, it in a sense disengages from the body and thus frees itself to roam the realm of adequate ideas, Huenemann proposes that insofar as the mind strives for adequacy, to that extent it relies less and less on imagination, a most physical process for Spinoza, thereby constructing its own "space" where it can be freed from the affects. What this means at the physical level may not be clear, but what is certain is not that we somehow "leave" our individual bodies but that we find ourselves operating as extension in general just as our minds no longer function as individual minds but as thought in general sub specie æternitatis. After having achieved this near mystical state of acquiescentia in se ipso, Huenemann rightly wonders why philosophers would concern themselves with politics or morality.

Rosenthal responds to Hegel's claim that Spinoza offers no philosophy of history. Rosenthal instead finds three building blocks for a philosophy of history in Spinoza's Ethics: there is no teleology in nature, so there is no built-in narrative; we strive to flourish though we are limited by the forces of chance; and we devise our own exemplar humanæ vitæ. Insofar as we are determined always to live with our passions, we may use reason to assist in our determined striving toward what we imagine is in our better interest. Reason can never eradicate the passions, though it may help corral them to get us ever closer to our constructed exemplar, which reflects and informs any narrative we have constructed. History for Spinoza, according to Rosenthal, is both the product and goal of the imagination, which maps out some narrative that (one hopes) promotes human flourishing, including Hegel's imagined universal teleology.

James' work links to Rosenthal's insofar as both touch on the role of the imagination and human flourishing. James argues that Spinoza's political philosophy claims to lead toward the common good, but the success of any democracy (or any other state) depends on the imaginations of its subjects. James faults Spinoza -- infamously a child of his times -- for his not being able to imagine that women, children, slaves, the inept, or criminals could have a role in democracy. It could be, then, that given the particular collective imagination of some specific cultural condition, some non-democracies may allow more freedom than some democracies.

Sorell dwells on an apparent tension within Spinoza's political philosophy as presented in the Tractatus theologico-politicus (TTP): insofar as Spinoza's civil state is a product of reason, it cannot be reality-based since the multitude is fundamentally irrational, but insofar as Spinoza's civil state is reality-based since it acknowledges that the multitude is led by its passions, it cannot be based on reason. Spinoza, Sorell thinks, wants to have his cake and eat it too by having a civil state that is both reality-based and rational. The key sticking point is how the imagination is supposed to function. The wise are free from the wiles of the imagination, which plays less a role for them in keeping society together, but the multitude under the yoke of imagination maintains the civil order. Sorell could be excused since his view of Spinoza seems chiefly due to his reading only Spinoza's TTP (and not the Ethics wherein this very problem is addressed in parts 3 and 4) through Hobbesian lenses. Alexandre Matheron (Individu et communauté chez Spinoza) and others have offered solutions to this paradox Sorell presents.

Garber presents the reader with a puzzle. Spinoza's universal faith, which is necessary to preserve the civil order, requires that people adhere to seven specific dogmata, some of which require quite an imaginative but entirely false conception of God. Faith is useful only insofar as one believes in its tenets, but Spinoza's own works -- both the TTP and the Ethics -- demonstrate the falsity of these tenets. Garber ponders, then, whether and how Spinoza could promulgate a philosophy that undermines religious belief.

Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays lives up to its name insofar as each writer does provide -- some more successfully than others -- a critical analysis of some tension or puzzle within Spinoza's philosophy. Those not yet acquainted with Spinoza scholarship may benefit most from this collection for its straightforward approach to many related issues within Spinoza's philosophy. Because all the essays touch on at least one of the three shared themes, the reader can appreciate the interconnectedness and general scope of Spinoza's system. Because many of the authors end their works with some rather open-ended questions, more active researchers, too, can profit from this collection as a springboard for further studies.