Interpreting Suárez: Critical Essays

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Daniel Schwartz (ed.), Interpreting Suárez: Critical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 218pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521509657.

Reviewed by Helen Hattab, University of Houston


Interpreting Suárez is a collection of eight philosophical essays, preceded by a highly informative introduction, on the philosophy of sixteenth century Jesuit philosopher and theologian, Francisco Suárez. It constitutes a most welcome addition to the growing body of philosophical literature on a figure who, while an intellectual giant of his day, was for a long time relegated to the annals of history. Until recently, interest in Suárez was often driven by the fact that he was the last of the Scholastics; the arch-representative of a decayed philosophical tradition and worthy rival who earned the respect and admiration of his modern victors. Among the Scholastics, his stature rivals that of St. Thomas Aquinas, and for those of us who work on early modern philosophy, his influence on modern philosophical thought is palpable. Some would go so far as to call Suárez the first of the moderns.

This volume takes a fresh approach, aiming not to determine the extent of the historical influence of Suárez's wide-ranging works, but "to provide a critical exposition of some of Suárez's anwers to philosophical questions that have traditionally exercised philosophers and theologians." (1) The overarching goal is to judge the value of his works not by their historical significance but on the basis of "the precise presentation of questions, his fair-minded and exhaustive consideration of opposing views, and the cogency and originality of his answers." (1) While readers with more than a superficial knowledge of Suárez's philosophy will also find much of interest in these chapters, they are especially suited to introducing a wider philosophical audience to some of the lasting philosophical contributions of this most complex and subtle of Scholastic thinkers.

Given its aims, the volume is well-constructed. The Introduction begins with a short biography that introduces us to the person behind the works. Drawing extensively on Raoul de Sorraille's recent biography of Suárez, this section provides a vivid glimpse into the life and times of its intellectual protagonist. It is followed by a short, but extremely helpful reminder regarding the role that philosophy played within Suárez's theological program. Daniel Schwartz, the editor, does his subject a great service by emphasizing "that neither Suárez nor his scholastic predecessors ever thought that citing the Bible in philosophical argument was sufficient to command the assent of the reader." (7) With this, the stage is set for the reader to embark on a serious engagement with Suárez as a potentially relevant philosopher. What follows are four chapters on key parts of Suárez's theoretical philosophy, three chapters on his practical philosophy, with a transitional chapter on his theory of action and freedom in the middle.

The authors include well-established experts on Suárez and Scholastic philosophy such as Jorge Gracia, Jorge Secada and Christopher Shields as well as philosophers known for their work in the history of philosophy, philosophy of religion, ethics and politics. Gracia co-authors the chapter on transcendentals and categories with Daniel Novotny, Shields contributes a chapter on the substantial form and Secada one on the ontology of relations. In addition, there is a chapter on the cosomological proof of God's existence by Bernie Catens. The chapters relating to Suárez's practical philosophy cover his major contributions to ethical and political philosophy, including a chapter on obligation, rightness and natural law by Terence Irwin, a chapter on distributive justice by Daniel Schwartz and a chapter on just war by Gregory Reichberg. Thomas Pink authors the chapter on action and freedom in Suárez's ethics. Each essay both delves deeply into its topic and situates Suárez's arguments on a specific set of issues within a broader philosophical context. I will first comment on the collection as a whole and then focus on select chapters rather than discussing each one.

The volume includes a good variety of topics; however, there are two notable gaps. First from the point of view of the more specialized reader, the absence of any discussion of Suárez's natural philosophy and psychology is surprising. The chapter on Suárez's arguments for the reality of substantial form limits itself to metaphysical issues, setting aside the role substantial forms played in natural philosophy. Despite the fact that there has been extensive recent scholarship on Suárez's views on causation and cognition, such metaphysical and epistemological topics that have direct bearing on natural philosophy are also absent from the volume. Several recent studies in these areas that devote a considerable amount of attention to Suárez's views are not listed in the bibliography (for instance, Freddoso 1991 and Schmaltz 2008 on causation and divine concurrence; Hattab 2009 on substantial forms and scientific demonstration; and South 2001 and 2002 on cognition). Their absence can be explained by the volume's focus on elements of Suárez's voluminous philosophical output that could be considered valuable independently of historical influence. Set aside the bigger question whether a theory's philosophical contribution can be so neatly severed from its historical situatedness. From a purely pragmatic point of view, the narrow focus on strictly metaphysical and practical questions makes the volume less useful to scholars interested in Suárez's philosophy as a whole and interrelations among its branches, and more suited to non-specialists and scholars with narrower interests in certain metaphysical issues and practical philosophy.

A more serious omission that is not so easily accounted for by the volume's aim and target audiences is the absence of a chapter on Suárez's rejection of the real distinction between being and essence. This was, arguably, his greatest metaphysical innovation and it had far-reaching implications for other parts of his philosophical system as well as subsequent metaphysical endeavors. While Schwartz devotes a paragraph to this aspect of Suárez's metaphysics in his introduction, this hardly seems sufficient. But concerns about coverage notwithstanding, this book is a rewarding read for specialists and non-specialists alike. The chapters that are included treat their subjects at a very high level, providing sufficient background and reference points for newcomers to orient themselves, as well as a good amount of detail and depth to engage the more seasoned scholar.

Some chapters, such as "The reality of substantial form: Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations XV" by Shields and "Suárez's cosmological argument for the existence of God" by Catens do a particularly good job of relating Suárez's arguments to contemporary metaphysical treatments of these topics as well as comparing Suárez's arguments to those of his immediate predecessors and successors. Interestingly, both conclude that Suárez's arguments are more sophisticated than previous ones, and far harder to refute by those who share his most fundamental philosophical commitments than acknowledged. Shields situates Suárez's view within more recent debates about mereology and concurs with recent studies that Suárez's defense of substantial forms is much more sophisticated than admitted by early modern detractors of this particular Scholastic entity. Overall, this chapter does a very thorough job of giving detailed and plausible reconstructions of different arguments made by Suárez in favor of substantial forms before evaluating their merit. It will be of particular interest to specialists in the history of medieval and modern philosophy and readers with an interest in mereology.

Catens likewise provides a very careful, thorough reconstruction of Suárez's metaphysical version of the cosmological proof of God's existence so as to show that it manages, in tandem with Suárez's other proofs, to avoid many problems that beset more standard versions of cosmological arguments for God's existence. There are a couple of instances where he reads Suárez as more modern than he is. At the end of Metaphysical Disputation 29, 2, 14 Suárez appeals to "the most beautiful machine of the universe" while making a teleological argument for the uniqueness of God. While no direct citation is given, Catens appears to have drawn on this passage to reach the conclusion that "Suárez believed that the universe was like a 'machine' that operated through fixed mechanical laws." (113) The phrase machina mundi was commonly used throughout the Middle Ages but as Alan Gabbey has shown, since 'machina' has a range of meanings, in this context, it should not be taken to imply that medieval philosophers thought of the universe as a machine governed by fixed laws. Suárez appears to be using the term in this older medieval sense as he nowhere implies that the natural order is governed by mechanical laws. Rather he claims that God creates the elements in accordance with a teleological order "on account of the good of the universe and on account of the generations also of mixed bodies . . . so that they have been created in that proportion which would be consonant with that end." (The Metaphysical Demonstration of the Existence of God Metaphysical Disputations 28-29, trans. John P. Doyle, 2004). While this minor inaccuracy does not undermine the general line of argument of this chapter it does suggest that caution must be exercised when we attempt to give historical arguments contemporary relevance. Regardless, this chapter will be of great interest to both philosophers of religion and historians of philosophy.

Other chapters serve to provide a more accurate understanding of Suárez's complex views and highlight just how different his concerns and approaches are from more familiar modern theories and /or current interpretations. In their chapter on "Fundamentals in Suárez's metaphysics: transcendentals and categories" Gracia and Novotny give a masterful breakdown of the ordinarily confusing maze of Scholastic debates about transcendentals and metaphysical categories, situating Suárez's arguments within them. This chapter is an invaluable springboard for delving into late Scholastic metaphysics and subsequent developments in early modern metaphysics. It provides the necessary background in such a concise and clear way that it is the kind of work one would want to assign to introduce graduate students to these issues.

Pink concludes his chapter on "Action and freedom in Suárez's Ethics" with a section on "The Hobbesian Critique" which serves to bring into relief the fundamental differences that account for the shift from the Scholastic view that freedom is constituted by law to the modern view that it is limited by law. Pink, in discussing the positions Suárez takes within the broader Scholastic, practical-reason-based approach, also draws helpful contrasts between Suárez's distinctive views and arguments and those of influential contemporaries such as Vasquez and Punch. Finally, Irwin's chapter on "Obligation, rightness, and natural law: Suárez and some critics" gives an extremely sensitive, in-depth examination of key texts, showing contra Finnis and Pink that Suárez has a coherent theory of obligation, that his sense of 'obligatio' as distinct from duty fits at least some contemporaneous uses, and that his view is not inconsistent with Aquinas'. Both chapters will be of great interest to historians of philosophy, ethicists and political philosophers alike. Indeed, all chapters in this volume are well-executed and will appeal to more than one type of reader.

As a whole, Interpreting Suárez makes an important contribution to the literature on Suárez by providing a more general philosophical audience and specialists in certain areas of metaphysics and practical philosophy with an entry point into Suárez's thought. It also constitutes a valuable teaching resource for professors who wish to cover Suárez's views on select issues in graduate seminars but require a guide to his challenging primary texts. More specialized readers, like myself, will also learn new things about Suárez from several chapters. In sum, this book has broad appeal and is well worth reading.