Interrogating the Real

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Slavoj Žižek, Interrogating the Real, edited by Rex Butler and Scott Stephens, Continuum Press, 2005, 392pp, $16.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826489737.

Reviewed by Rebecca Kukla, Carleton University


Slavoj Žižek , nicknamed the "Giant of Ljubljana", is underrated as a professional philosopher and overrated outside of the discipline of philosophy. Within academic philosophy, he is seen as a footnote to Lacan, who is in turn utterly marginalized from the mainstream. But outside of the discipline, he has been the subject of a full-length documentary (Žižek!, directed by Astra Taylor, 2005), had a punk band (Laibach) and a virtual nation (NSK, at founded in his honour, made a serious run for president in Slovenia, and written the text for an Abercrombie and Fitch catalogue. Both of these receptions seem out of touch with reality: In fact, Žižek is neither more nor less than a sensible and insightful reader of important writers such as Kant, Hegel, Marx, and Lacan, who is erudite, preposterously prolific, and funny, and whose trademark is using popular culture -- jokes, movies, operas, advertisements -- as a rich source of philosophical examples. Through his many cleverly titled books, such as Enjoy Your Symptom!, Everything You Ever Wanted to Know about Lacan (but were Afraid to Ask Hitchcock), and The Ticklish Subject, Žižek has -- for those paying attention -- shown us why and how Lacan ought to be taken seriously by philosophers, and defended a rich metaphysical and political account of ideology.

Interrogating the Real is billed by its editors, Rex Butler and Scott Steven, as Volume I of Žižek's collected papers. The book consists of 15 essays written over the last several decades, mostly between the late 1980s and the mid 1990s. The essays vary greatly in their formality; some are transcribed student or public lectures, some are interviews, and some are reprinted journal articles. Many of the pieces previously appeared only in obscure places, so it is helpful to have them available in a single, readily accessible volume. The pieces reflect the enormous breadth of Žižek's interests and knowledge, as well as pet themes and examples that will be familiar to his longtime readers: He discusses Kant, German Idealism, Heidegger, Derrida, postmodernism, ontology, ideology, Marx, Freud, Lacan, feminist theory and practice, several analytic philosophers including Daniel Dennett and Ray Jackendoff, anti-Semitism, nationalism, Levi-Strauss, Kafka, Alfred Hitchcock, Wagner's operas, Vodka advertisements, and several versions of Mutiny on the Bounty, to give just a small sample. Žižek is especially adept at giving philosophical/psychoanalytic readings of jokes, clichés, and other cultural sound bites. However, this volume itself brings no particular organization to all of this. It is divided into three parts, but I honestly could not understand the editors' explanation of this tripartite division, nor could I detect any systematic differences between the essays in each grouping. There is a great deal of repetition from essay to essay, with many anecdotes and examples, as well as some of the more extended arguments, showing up in several of the essays. The brief editors' introduction is harder to follow than Žižek's own prose, and the glossary at the end presupposes more than illuminates Lacanian terminology and theory.

One of the reasons, perhaps, why Žižek's importance has not been clear to philosophers is that he usually packages himself as a hard-line Lacanian who is only interested in insisting upon a literal return to Lacan's texts, and most of the essays in this volume are also spoken in this voice. Hence if we take him at his word, at least on a superficial reading, we are tempted to dismiss him as a mere expositor of a figure with whom most philosophers are not engaged anyhow. However, one cannot take Žižek's claims of literal fidelity to the texts at face value. For he also insists as a matter of principle that texts almost always mean nearly the opposite of what they appear on the surface to mean, and that authors are radically out of control of the meanings of their texts.

The 'real', for Lacan (or at least for the Lacan that Žižek identifies with), is precisely the residue or supplement that is not fully captured in symbolic discourse. In its organizing and symbolizing activities, language always falls short of exhausting or mastering its own topic, and it is the 'kernel' that is left over that forms the real to which it is ultimately accountable. Žižek argues that the 'real' kernel that is not brought into and mastered by language is not something that grounds and predates language, but rather a product of our symbolic activities themselves, which always, in trying to capture and organize the empirical world, do so by leaving behind a residue of contingency and unmastered reality that stands ready to thwart our claims. Hence when Žižek repeatedly avers that he is just giving Lacan's 'real' meaning, we should not assume that he is speaking innocently. Indeed, he repeatedly turns standard readings of Lacan on their head. Žižek's Lacan is more materialist, more Marxist, more attuned to the workings of ideology, less psychologistic, less biologically reductionist, more of a metaphysician, and less of a psychoanalyst -- that is, more Žižekian -- than the Lacan we are used to. Furthermore, one of Žižek's central and repeated claims is that "Lacan is fundamentally Hegelian, but without knowing it",1 and Hegel emphasized that texts only imperfectly grasp their contact with the truth they express, and that philosophical progress is always a matter of grasping more completely and undistortedly that which has already been said. For Žižek, following Hegel, the 'truth' of a text can be uncovered only retroactively, through its rereading from a position that has surpassed it. We need to assume that this is his approach to Hegel's and Lacan's own texts, and hence that his professed fidelity to these authors ought not to be taken as naïve or slavish.

Many of the essays in Interrogating the Real defend what I think of as Žižek's 'immanent Platonism' -- a metaphysical picture that is familiar from his other writings. Just as language never exhaustively captures contingent empirical reality, likewise, Žižek argues, contingent empirical reality never manages to live up to the crisp boundaries and necessary logic of its symbolic representations. To use a couple of his favorite examples: real, fleshy fathers, and real, fleshy judges, in all their contingency and frailty, never fully embody the role of the Father or the Judge -- these are figures with absolute authority, whose narrative has a fixed and necessary logic. But, Žižek argues, we should not conclude that the symbolic forms of which empirical reality always falls short are mere false fantasies. Rather, these symbolic figures, even though they are never fully empirically incarnated, have a genuine, material, structuring effect upon the concrete world. We interact with our contingent surroundings through the logic of their neater symbolic complements, and indeed empirical figures and objects would not exist in the form they do were it not for these symbolic complements: for example, no one could actually be an empirical judge were it not for the fact that they (partially) inhabit the position of the symbolic Judge (this is the cornerstone of Žižek's reading of Kafka's The Trial). He writes: "[We can imagine] a judge who is a miserable and corrupted person, but the moment they put on their robe and other insignia, their words are the words of Law itself. It's the same with paternal authority: a real father exerts authority only insofar as he posits himself as the embodiment of a transcendent symbolic agency, insofar as he accepts that it is not himself, but the big Other who speaks through him, in his words" (286-7). Likewise, to use another of Žižek's pet examples, there could be no such thing as physical money -- which is made of paper or metal, and can degenerate or break -- if there were not such a thing as formal Money for it to incarnate, which has no particular physical instantiation but can rather be translated without loss of identity from virtual form to paper form to check form, and which has no empirical potential for degeneration.

For Žižek, symbolic shadows of empirical figures and objects -- a shadow Father behind our real father, a shadow Judge behind the actual judge -- need to be understood as having their own kind of formal reality and causal power, while at the same time they could not exist were it not for the (imperfect) material incarnations through which they operate. And, he argues, this power is not merely psychological. The point is not that our internal ideas of things help structure our relation to them, though this is surely true as well. That is, it is not just that my internal representation of my father as more powerful, more judgmental, and more embedded in an Oedipal narrative than he is affects my actual interactions with and perceptions of him. Rather, quite aside from what's going on 'in our heads', our material practices are premised upon and shaped by an ontology of clean forms governed by a neat logic, rather than by the messy reality that occasionally thwarts these practices. An ontology of money as indestructible, digital, and translatable from one material incarnation to another is built into our actual economic practices, and requires no particular beliefs of this sort on the part of its users.

Žižek contrasts figures like the Father and the Judge, who have their causal efficacy through their material 'representatives' -- the empirical individuals who incarnate them -- with figures like the Jew, which he claims manifest a related but opposite logic. Just as actual fathers never live up to the ideological figure of the father, Žižek argues, actual Jews never live up to the ideological (anti-Semitic) figure of the Jew. But the figure of the Jew -- like the figure of Keyser Soeze from The Usual Suspects -- earns its social power precisely from the fact that its material incarnation remains hidden behind the scenes (287-8). For the anti-Semite, Žižek argues here and in several other works, the Jews they actually meet (neighbors, doctors, shopkeepers) are always interpreted as 'exceptions' -- none of these are ever the paradigmatic Jew who is controlling the world economy, or whatever, from behind closed doors. Because of the gap between formal figures and their material incarnations, and because it is the formal figure that organizes social relations, we get the odd and politically important result that such formal representations are immune to empirical modification or refutation. No matter that each Jew the anti-Semite has met has been friendly and generous -- each can be dismissed as an atypical exception to the 'conceptual Jew' (287 and elsewhere). Analogously, no matter that a judge reveals himself as morally frail, corruptible, and intellectually limited -- his word still functions as an arbiter of truth.

The formal, symbolic figures that organize social life are ideological figures, in Žižek's terminology, and their relations are ideological fictions. For Žižek, as for one of his favorite authors, Althusser, ideology is an important metaphysical or ontological category, and not just a political one. Whereas Marx arguably understood ideology as a 'false representation', an imaginary overlay upon social reality that masked its real power relations and hence produced 'false consciousness', Žižek and Althusser do not read ideology as existing at the level of mental representations, but rather as built into the material practices and institutions that structure our social environment. Our actual court system is constituted by the ideological figures and fictions of the fair trial, judge, impartial jury, fully autonomous and responsible defendant, etc.; our actual economic relations are constituted by the fiction of the perfectly 'free' market. Thus ideology cannot be 'stripped away' to reveal some underlying non-ideological truth; rather, we and our social world are 'ideological all the way down', because we are constituted -- imperfectly -- by ideological practices and forms: A "non-naïve notion of ideology … avoids the usual traps of, if you say ideology, false consciousness, then you automatically imply some kind of natural direct approach to what reality truly is, etc. You don't need this. What you need is precisely the notion that reality itself is never fully constituted, and that this is what ideological spectral fantasies try to mask" (86). Žižek claims that his "entire work circulates" around a set of "parallatic gaps" -- that is, gaps between the formal objects and characters that structure our social life and their empirical manifestations, or between ideologically completed versions of objects and their imperfect incarnations (10).

A crucial effect of ideology, for Žižek, is that it makes that which is in fact a contingent product of social relations appear necessary and 'built in' to the 'natural world'. Ideology presents the father as 'naturally' authoritative, commodities as 'naturally' valuable, unequal relations between races or sexes as based in biology, and so forth. "The free market, multi-party elections, etc… . This most spontaneous self-experience of how you are getting rid of some imposed artificial order and returning to some kind of, let us say, non-ideological natural state of things, I think, is the basic … gesture of ideology" (65). Such naturalizing myths, while always ripe for being overthrown, provide an apparently secure foundation for the legitimacy and authority of our existing social relations, in the face of the fact that this legitimacy and authority always rests upon a contingent and underdetermining history. Indeed, ideology can afford a kind of hyper-natural status to social arrangements: "Liberal capitalism will exist even if [because of ecological catastrophe] the Earth no longer exists" (64). Žižek argues that communities and institutions are held together by 'symbolic fictions' or 'noble lies' that organize their power relations and practices. He follows Hegel in claiming that retroactively, our ideological fictions lend the weight of natural necessity to organizations of social relations that actually emerged out of messy contingency. Disruptions of these fictions are received not as rational challenges, but as violence (255-6).

Žižek is a master at finding unexpected unity in his dizzyingly diverse themes. However, his characteristic insistence upon seeing everything as related to absolutely everything else, from jokes to philosophical texts to dreams to operas, can be infuriating for philosophers. Especially in these short, self-contained essays, Žižek rarely has time to rigorously delve into or defend the suggestive connections he draws. In Interrogating the Real, we see Žižek dancing around his traditional philosophical themes and problematics, but we don't get a sustained and developed central argument. For fans of Žižek, this book will be a valued contribution to a collection, and one that will satisfy a craving for his distinctive style. On the other hand, it is not likely to be a good introduction to the author for philosophers. Žižek deserves to be read more widely, but philosophers should probably begin with his classic unified works such as The Sublime Object of Ideology or Tarrying with the Negative.

1 Interrogating the Real, 28. All future references to this text will appear as parenthetical page numbers.