Intersections of Value: Art, Nature, and the Everyday

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Robert Stecker, Intersections of Value: Art, Nature, and the Everyday, Oxford University Press, 2019, 174pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198789956.

Reviewed by James Edward Harold, Mount Holyoke College


Robert Stecker's short book discusses a large number of philosophical questions. Sometimes these questions intersect with one another, but sometimes they do not. There is no one principal line of argument or even a single central topic that runs through the book. Instead, Stecker's book is structured around a few recurring themes including: the relationships between different kinds of values (aesthetic, artistic, cognitive, etc.); the proper way to appreciate natural environments; and the importance of the function of everyday artifacts. The result is a book that is not easy to sum up. I will begin with a quick chapter by chapter overview, and then turn to a critical discussion of the book and some of the arguments and ideas in it.

The book has three parts. After an introductory chapter, Stecker spends Chapters 2, 3, and 4 discussing aesthetic and artistic value. Stecker's main aims in this part are to defend the distinction between the two kinds of values, and to defend a pluralistic account of artistic value. Part II (Chapters 5 and 6) concerns the relationship between moral, aesthetic, cognitive, and artistic values and argues for certain kinds of interaction (but against others) between those values. Part III (Chapters 7 through 9) takes up the appreciation of nature and ordinary artifacts and argues for a kind of middle-ground view on various controversies involving them. A very brief concluding chapter summarizes the main points.

Chapter 1 aims to motivate the problems taken up later in the book, and to establish a few preliminary points. First, Stecker wants to show that both art and the aesthetic are universal, that aesthetic values are distinct from other kinds of values, and that they relate to one another in a variety of ways. He then sketches a distinction between aesthetic and artistic value, and discusses the question of what value is in general. Of these discussions, the most important is the distinction Stecker draws between aesthetic and artistic value, which is the topic he returns to and fills out more fully in Chapters 2 through 4.

In Chapter 2, Stecker sets out his experiential account of aesthetic value. Aesthetic value is the value of a type of experience, but the objects of experience also have aesthetic value because they are potential sites for aesthetic experience. These experiences must also be valued for their own sake in order to be aesthetic. Stecker then defends his experiential account against a variety of objections. Most importantly, he argues that a theory of aesthetic value in terms of experience is compatible with there being aesthetic properties. This chapter will be of great interest to those involved the debate over experiential accounts of the aesthetic.

In Chapter 3, Stecker sets out his initial view of artistic value and shows what makes it distinct from aesthetic value. On Stecker's view, artistic value is "a function of, and derived from, a plurality of more basic values, including, but not confined to, aesthetic value." (42) These more basic values include cognitive, ethical, art-historical, and interpretation-centered values, as well as aesthetic values. He offers a test to tell whether a value is artistic or not: "A property of an artwork is artistically valuable if knowing or recognizing that the work has the valuable property requires grasping the work's meaning (usually by interpretation)." (52) (As I discuss below, however, Stecker first revises and then seems to back away from this test.) Chapter 3 also introduces the notion of entanglement, which is when one type of value cannot be explained or appreciated without mentioning the other, a concept I also return to below.

Chapter 4 offers us two different definitions of artistic value, but doesn't choose between them: the composite theory and the buck-passing theory. The composite theory says that artistic value is constituted by the various lower-level values -- cognitive, aesthetic, ethical, etc.; the buck-passing theory (from Dominic McIver Lopes) says that artistic value is the conjunction of the values of individual arts (music, literature, etc.). Stecker concludes that either of these definitions will be satisfactory for his purposes.

In Part II Chapter 5 takes on ethical values and Chapter 6 cognitive values. Chapter 5 specifically focuses on the question of value "inversions." Stecker distinguishes between two kinds of inversion: aesthetic value inversions, where an aesthetic quality that is normally a merit (like elegance) becomes a demerit; and ethical-artistic value inversions, where ethical merits in artworks become artistic demerits. Stecker thinks that aesthetic inversion is real and that many of the apparent cases of ethical-artistic value inversion are actually cases of aesthetic value inversions. The principle that he relies on here is this: "a purported defect in a work is a genuine one only if it has a negative effect on the overall artistic value of the work." (74) Using this principle, Stecker concludes that the main cause of inversion is the instrumental role of aesthetic values, which allows their normal valence to change in unusual circumstances, though he does not entirely rule out the possibility of genuine ethical-artistic value inversions.

In Chapter 6, Stecker argues in favor of a rather limited form of cognitivism, in which through art we come to acquire new hypotheses that we can test for truth on our own (a view quite reminiscent of Peter Kivy's[1]). This cognitivism counts as a kind of artistic interaction, since the presence of cognitive value increases artistic value. Stecker offers arguments against both inflationism (of the more robust sort) and deflationism. Cognitive values, he says, are constituents of artistic value that arise from aesthetic experience.

Part III begins with two discussions of the norms for the aesthetic appreciation of nature. Chapter 7 considers scientific norms, and Chapter 8 considers moral ones. In Chapter 7, Stecker surveys some well-known arguments in environmental aesthetics that attempt to ground constraints on the appropriate objects and type of aesthetic engagement in scientific knowledge. Stecker rejects these arguments. As in the previous chapter, Stecker prefers a more limited and modest version of the view -- in this case, a weak scientific cognitivism whereby science constrains how we arrive at determinate observations, and which rules out aesthetic judgments based on false beliefs.

In Chapter 8, Stecker considers moral norms on the aesthetic appreciation of nature. He considers and rejects two norms: one is based on moral-aesthetic interaction, specifically a merited response argument, and the other is based on respect for nature. Stecker then formulates his own norm, a reformulated version of the merited response argument. But, somewhat confusingly, he then wavers about the application of his own norm, saying that "there is no moral requirement that we adopt this norm." (137)

Chapter 9 is mostly independent of the preceding chapters. In it, Stecker discusses artifacts, and argues that the aesthetic qualities of artifacts are mostly independent from the question of artifact function. He further argues that artifacts help us in a larger appreciative enterprise: appreciating a way of life of which the artifact is a part. In this way, he thinks that appreciating non-art artifacts is much like appreciating artworks. This is followed by a very brief (four page) Chapter 10, which sums up the book and offers a few further thoughts.

A few things strike one about Stecker's book. The first is the book's dogged determination to find a middle ground on any number of questions. This is in many respects quite admirable. While it is easier to get attention in philosophy by staking out and defending extreme views, the truth is often found somewhere closer to the middle, and Stecker is often persuasive when he shows us that the extreme positions on an issue are poorly supported and that more moderate views are both available and plausible. However, his fondness for moderation sometimes leads his reader into confusion. In a few places, Stecker devotes time to raising a difficult question, only to leave things unsettled. For example, in Chapter 1, he raises a very interesting and deep question -- what is value? -- discusses various possibilities, and then puts the matter aside unresolved. After a six-page discussion of various axiological theories, he writes:

It is clearly not possible to adjudicate among these alternatives here. That would be a large project in its own right. Nor do I have a commitment to one of these theories of value. I am not sure that one theory has to be the right one across all values. At least now we know some of the chief approaches to understanding what a value is, and that will suffice for our purposes later. (16)

But Stecker never returns to this topic again -- at least, this reader could not see how the discussion of these different axiological theories informed any later discussions in the book. And, given that he does not take a stand, one wonders what the purpose of raising the question was in the first place.

In other places, Stecker seems to waver between treating a question as having been answered and leaving it open. Chapter 3's test for determining whether or not a value is artistic is a good example. The first version of the test said: "A property of an artwork is artistically valuable if knowing that the work has the valuable property requires grasping the work's meaning (usually by interpretation)." (52) Then, in response to some objections, Stecker revises the test: "A value V found in an artwork w is an artistic value if knowing or recognizing that w has V requires us to either experience w with understanding or to have the kind of understanding of w that is derived from interpreting it." (56) However, later on in the book (88), Stecker reverts back to the first version of the test, without explanation. Then he offers an alternative to the test: instead of employing the test, we can simply appeal "to the intentions of artists and the expectations of audiences." (88) But is this really equivalent to the test (in either version)? It doesn't appear to be, and Stecker doesn't try to show that it is. He seems to think that it doesn't matter whether we use the test or not (or which version), which raises the question of why he devotes so much time to defending the test in the first place.

Similarly, at the end of Chapter 8, after arguing for a moral norm to constrain our aesthetic appreciation of nature, Stecker immediately backs away from it. The norm is: "states of nature resulting from humanly caused environmental degradation do not merit judgments that they are beautiful." (135) He has a clear and plausible argument for this principle, and the principle itself, if true, is consequential. But then he goes on to argue that there is in fact no requirement to follow this norm. What, then, is the import of a norm that lacks any force? The reader is left wondering.

The second striking feature of the book is that its lack of focus means that some lines of argument seem underexplored. The book's title is Intersections of Value; and the book introduces two kinds of intersection between values: interaction and entanglement. Interaction between two values means either that "the presence of one kind of value entails the existence of another" (2) or that "the presence of one enhances or detracts from the degree of the other" (55 fn. 5); entanglement between two values means that "we cannot fully explain or appreciate at least one of these values without mentioning the other." (54) Stecker tells us that interaction is not symmetrical: so, for example, work w's cognitive value can increase its artistic value, but w's artistic value need not increase or decrease its cognitive value. But entanglement is symmetrical: if cognitive value and artistic value are entangled in work w, then explaining w's cognitive value will require explaining its artistic value and vice versa. He also says that every interaction relation is also an entanglement relation, but there might be entanglement without interaction.

This intriguing account raises a whole host of questions. What explanatory and appreciative purposes matter for entanglement? Are they always the same? Could we sometimes think that we have fully explained a value even though that value affects the presence of some other value? What is meant by a "full" explanation or appreciation? This seems like a context-dependent notion. What might entanglement look like when it happens without interaction? More on the different varieties of intersection might have been enlightening.

Similarly, Chapter 5 includes an interesting but too brief discussion of the factors that make an artwork immoral in the first place. Stecker argues that it is not easy to establish that an artwork is immoral. First, he observes that if imagining adopting an immoral perspective leads one to moral insight, it's not obvious what is morally wrong with the imagining. Second, he points out that many of the works that are thought to be wrong in this way (such as "rough hero" narratives) do in fact ultimately condemn the actions of their immoral protagonists. I find this quite powerful, but there is a great deal more to say here. In her original discussion of the rough hero,[2] A.W. Eaton acknowledges Stecker's point: such works do indeed tend to morally condemn their rough heroes -- but they also engender sympathy with them. In effect, rough hero narratives try to have it both ways, and Eaton finds this fact to be morally unacceptable. So there is an interesting difference here between Stecker and Eaton, and I think more to say.

These are, however, minor complaints, and any book will raise philosophical questions that it does not address to the reader's satisfaction. And this leads to the third striking feature of Stecker's book: the individual chapters (or sometimes sections of chapters) work very well as small self-contained philosophical discussions. Stecker writes clearly and is inclined to give a fair hearing to a variety of points of view. His arguments are nicely laid out and generally quite compelling. Readers looking for a well-informed and careful defense of the experiential theory of aesthetic value would be hard-pressed to find a better example than Chapter 2; those interested in a critical perspective on the scientific constraints on the aesthetic appreciation of nature would benefit greatly from reading Chapter 7; and Stecker's critical attack on function-based analyses of the aesthetic value of artifacts in Chapter 9 is excellent.

If the weakness of this book is that the whole does not always prove to be more than the sum of its parts, the book's strength is found in those parts. The book covers a lot of ground, and the various stops along the way are vividly presented and carefully argued.

[1] Kivy, Peter, "The Laboratory of Fictional Truth," in his Philosophies of Arts: An Essay in Differences (Cambridge University Press, 1997), 120-139.

[2] Eaton, A.W., "Rough Heroes of the New Hollywood," Revue Internationale de Philosophie 258 (2010): 511-524.