Intersubjectivity and Objectivity in Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl: A Collection of Essays

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Christel Fricke and Dagfinn Føllesdal (eds.), Intersubjectivity and Objectivity in Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl: A Collection of Essays, Ontos, 2012, 315pp., €98 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381450

Reviewed by David Woodruff Smith, University of California, Irvine


This is an astute collection of astute essays.

Why bring together essays on Adam Smith (1723-1790), the architect of free-market economic theory, and Edmund Husserl (1859-1938), the founder of phenomenology? In a word: empathy, and/or sympathy, the foundation of social or "intersubjective" awareness, in both objective scientific judgment and objective moral evaluation. This complex intentional state is central to Adam Smith's moral theory (allied with his economic theory) and to Husserl's phenomenology of embodied perception, collective consciousness, and moral evaluation. More precisely, as the essays intersubjectively work to bring out, there is a complex of related intentional states involved in empathy, sympathy, compassion, moral judgment, scientific judgment, social reality, and the many activities characteristic of "human nature" (as Hume and Smith used that term).

The editors began talking about common interests and then organized a workshop on the title's themes, meeting in 2007 and again in 2008 in Oslo. The essays grew out of those meetings. Christel Fricke has worked on Adam Smith's philosophy; Dagfinn Føllesdal, on Husserl's philosophy.

The volume includes nine essays contextualized by the editors' substantial Introduction. The range of the volume is evident in the authors' titles:

Frode Kjosavik, A Phenomenological Approach to Intersubjectivity in the Sciences.

Henning Peucker, Husserl's Approach to Volitional Consciousness.

Ronald McIntyre, "We-Subjectivity": Husserl on Community and Communal Constitution.

Christian Beyer, Husserl on Understanding Persons.

John J. Drummond, Imagination and Appresentation, Sympathy and Empathy in Smith and Husserl.

Iso Kern, Mengzi (Mencius), Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl on Sympathy and Conscience.

Christel Fricke, Overcoming Disagreement -- Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl on Strategies of Justifying Descriptive and Evaluative Judgments.

Vivienne Brown, Intersubjectivity and Moral Judgment in Adam Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments.

Samuel Fleischacker, Sympathy in Hume and Smith: a Contrast, Critique, and Reconstruction.

The authors -- from universities in Norway, Germany, the UK, Canada, and the United States -- include both Husserl scholars and Adam Smith scholars, some addressing both Smith and Husserl in their essays. The essays are clearly written, well argued, and genuinely illuminating, evidently benefiting from the authors' interaction in the workshop environment (including amicable disagreements).

The editors' Introduction to the volume maps the lay of the land (pp. 5-16). Thus, Adam Smith joined David Hume as a key philosopher of the 18th century Scottish Enlightenment. Edmund Husserl founded the 20th century movement of phenomenology. Both Smith and Husserl reacted to Hume's philosophy, with sympathetic disagreement. Smith wrote The Theory of Moral Sentiments (1750) and The Wealth of Nations (1776). Husserl wrote Logical Investigations (1900-01) and Ideas (1913, in Books One and Two) (and much more!). Where Hume is well-known as a skeptic in epistemology and as a theorist of "sentiment"-based ethics, Smith is best known today as an economic theorist, though his moral theory is gaining attention nowadays and plays a pivotal role in his economic theory. The chief moral sentiment, for Smith, is what he and Hume called sympathy. "Sympathy" in Smith's usage covers a variety of phenomena including both empathy and sympathy as we today use those terms. (Cf. A. Smith 1750/2002, pp. 11-20, on "sympathy", "fellow-feeling", "compassion", etc.) Husserl focused inter alia on issues of epistemology (theory of knowledge) and phenomenology (theory of conscious experience), though his relatively limited writings on ethical theory are gaining attention among scholars nowadays. Fricke and Føllesdal note that both Smith and Husserl admired Hume but rejected Hume's skepticism, both epistemological and moral. Here is where the volume joins "intersubjectivity and objectivity" in "Adam Smith and Edmund Husserl", in studying their respective analyses of the grounds of these phenomena in empathy, sympathy, and kindred states of consciousness.

For Hume, we seek objectivity through subjective phenomena, with sensory "impressions" plus cognitive "ideas" leading us toward an objective world of physical nature, and with moral "sentiments" leading us toward objective values in "human nature". In this respect Hume is a proto-phenomenologist. Of course, Hume's skepticism apparently pulls us back from knowing objective "reality", leaving us limited in our subjective human nature, including our moral sentiments. However, for Smith, we gain objectively valid moral judgments through appropriate sympathy with others. And in the social realm, for Smith, our economic activity is supposed to be guided by sympathy for others (a feature lost on contemporary Adam Smith free-marketeers).

For Husserl, we gain theoretical objectivity in valid judgments about nature grounded in appropriate sensory cum conceptual experience. Similarly, we gain normative objectivity in valid moral judgments grounded in appropriate experiences that include intentional activities of will, reason, and love. (Cf. D. W. Smith 2007, Chapter 8) For Husserl, like Adam Smith, empathy and sympathy are forms of experience that play essential roles in moral judgment -- though, Fricke and Føllesdal note, Husserl paid more and better attention to Hume than to Smith. In Husserl's day, circa 1910, the phenomenon of empathy -- whence intersubjectivity, or experiential relations between subjects -- was under close study, in empirical psychology and psychoanalysis and importantly in Husserl's own transcendental phenomenology. Accordingly, theorists were beginning to mark the difference between empathy (apprehending another's subjective experience) and sympathy (caring for the other as in "I share your pain"). And so Husserl came to emphasize objectivity as apprehended in intersubjectivity, which is grounded via empathy in individual subjectivity. (See Husserl 1912/1989, Ideas II. There are three thick volumes of Husserl's Nachlass writings on intersubjectivity, from 1905 onward. These are not translated into English, but Ideas II works in revealing detail with aspects of intersubjectivity.)

The English term "empathy" was coined as a translation of the German "Einfühlung", literally meaning how I feel my way into another's experience. The terms "Einfühlung" and "Intersubjectivität" are recurrent in many of Husserl's writings. On Husserl's account of empathy, Einfühlung, I apprehend another's experience as if I were in the other's place, as if I were in "other I" 's experience. For Husserl, my knowledge of the world around me begins in my perceptual experience of things, an experience centered on my experience of my own "living" body. When I see a physical thing, I see it as located with respect to my body. Yet I apprehend it as "there for anyone", there for you to see as located with respect to your body. Here is the basic experience of "intersubjectivity": the objectively existing tree before me is available for your experience, and I see you as seeing the same tree from your perspective. By empathy I apprehend you as a fellow subject, another "I", with an embodied visual perspective like mine, only yours. Here is a basic structure of experience in our common "life-world", or Lebenswelt: things in our surrounding world, or Umwelt, are objectively there and are intersubjectively experienced through empathy as objectively there (for anyone). Moreover, for Husserl, there are objective values in our surrounding world, values we apprehend intersubjectively.  I experience an object -- this tree, that bicycle, that person's action -- only through a "horizon" of associated concepts or meanings, which may include value-predicates. When I apprehend another's experience through empathy, however, I do not myself experience the other's experience ("primordially"), and I do not necessarily carry my own "horizon" of associations into the other's experience. This complication sets the scene for the essays in the Fricke-Føllesdal volume. (Again, see Husserl, Ideas II. Cf. D. W. Smith 1989, Chapter 3, on empathy; D. W. Smith 2007, Chapter 9, tying together threads of Husserl's account of objectivity, subjectivity, and intersubjectivity.)

The implications of the theory of empathy and intersubjectivity are variously explored in the nine essays. While I cannot address all of them here, I should like to draw some specific results from a few of the essays. Similarities between the two authors are drawn in the essays and are well summarized in the editors' Introduction. What impresses me is the story line that emerges by drawing together ideas from Smith and Husserl despite nearly two centuries of distance.

Iso Kern's essay (pp. 139-170) may set the tone. It was Kern who edited the three volumes of Husserl's writings on intersubjectivity -- texts that arguably established the concept as we know it after Husserl. In his essay Kern digs into Adam Smith's use of the term "sympathy" in moral theory, and Kern finds moral resonance in the ancient Chinese writings of Mengzi ("Mencius", in the West), reading both against a deep knowledge of Husserl's account of intersubjectivity. Kern distinguishes several distinct phenomena of "sympathy" in Adam Smith's The Theory of Moral Sentiments (pp. 156-157). First, there is "sympathy" where I "look in imagination at the situation of the observed person with the eyes of this person". Second, there is "sympathy" where I find "'correspondence' between the observer's [my] own actual feelings and emotions and the feelings and emotions of the observed person as 'sympathetically' imagined by this observer". Third, there is "sympathy" in "moral approbation" where "we approve of [the other's feelings] when we find ourselves 'sympathizing' with them". Distinguishing these three phenomena clears the ground for a formulation of Smith's theory that an impartial observer employing "sympathy", in these three forms, will form a proper judgment about the moral correctness of an action. Kern pursues this aspect of moral evaluation with what he has found in Mengzi. Kern's careful comparisons among the accounts of "sympathy" and "empathy" in Husserl, Smith, and Mengzi would imply that there is a complex of basic forms of experience in human beings across the millennia and across different cultures -- the "phenomena themselves", on which our culturally formed words and concepts bear.

Vivienne Brown's essay (pp. 243-272) studies Adam Smith's account of intersubjectivity in moral judgment, tying into contemporary literature on Smith's moral theory and on empathy. Seeking "a consistent and intelligible theory of mind in Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments" (p. 243), Brown (not unlike Kern) traces out distinctions among my imagining myself in the other's shoes, my understanding the other's attitudes as her own, and my approving of the other's emotions (and hence actions). Brown builds from Smith's texts a "tripartite model" of intersubjectivity:

Thus, in addition to the notion of affective sympathy, Smith's complex of technical uses involving sympathy comprises: The spectator's sympathetic emotions -- the core notion of sympathy; the spectator's sympathizing with the other to the extent that his sympathetic emotions correspond with (what he takes to be) the other's feelings; and, possibly, sympathy as correspondence between the spectator's sympathetic emotions and (what he takes to be) the other's feelings. (pp. 246-247)

Along the way, Brown draws on contemporary models of empathy, notably the "theory theory" and the "simulation" theory (pp. 248ff.), and on moral theorist Stephen Darwall's argument that Adam Smith's account of "sympathy" should be seen as addressing what we now call "empathy" (pp. 251-254). Brown emphasizes that for Darwall empathy should be seen as a normative attitude: for in "projective empathy", as Darwall has put it, "we place ourselves in the other's situation and work out what to feel, as though we were they" (Brown quoting Darwall, p. 252). Then empathy is neither just a "theory" about the other's mind, nor a "simulation" of the other's feeling, but a normative "sympathy" -- as needed, arguably, for Smith's theory of moral judgment founded on an impartial observer's "sympathy" with the emotions and actions of the person judged.

Husserl scholars will note that Husserl's account of empathy is very different from recent models of empathy either as third-person theorizing about another's mind or as first-person projective imagination about the other's mind. For Husserl, empathy is rather a form of "intuition", a direct awareness or acquaintance with the other's experience (per D. W. Smith 1989). This awareness is without inference or imaginative projection into the other's shoes. Aspects of this phenomenon are observed in the essays by Ronald McIntyre, Christian Beyer, and John Drummond. In any event, I should like to close with a further issue: how, on Husserl's analysis, "we" work together to "constitute" objective phenomena through our "intersubjective" activities.

Ronald McIntyre's essay (pp. 61-92) develops a sharp and nuanced account of what Husserl called the "we-subject" and "our" communal "constitution" of things in our "surrounding world". Recent studies of collective intentionality in analytic philosophy (by Raimo Tuomela, John Searle, Margaret Gilbert, Kay Mathiesen, and others) have sometimes been suspected of positing a collective subject conceived as a big mind in the sky (or at least an autonomous "collective" as in the 19th century tradition of Marx, Weber, Durkheim). McIntyre's reconstruction of Husserl's theory of intersubjectivity shows what a collective subject is without recourse to a kind of Übergeist. On McIntyre's interpretation:

A "we-subject" is a collection of persons whose members are joined by relations of empathy and empathic grouping; share common interests, feelings, and values; grant credibility to one another in co-constituting their domain of interests and its values; and engage in communal activities coordinated and driven by a communal will. (p. 89)

This higher-order "we-subject" is not itself a type of mind or subject, but rather a formal union of subjects of consciousness, wherein "we" subjects are bound together in this unity precisely as "we" collectively "constitute" things in our surrounding world. In fact, I would add, this form of entity, this collective of intersubjectively related subjects, is a case of what Husserl called a "manifold" (Mannigfaltigkeit). (As recounted in D. W. Smith 2007, this notion of manifold, drawn in Husserl's formal ontology, plays a recurrent but neglected role in Husserl's philosophy.)

As McIntyre notes (pp. 62-63), the "constitution" of a given object, in Husserl's scheme, consists in a pattern or "horizon" of meanings or "senses", what Husserl calls "noemata". Where these meanings are entertained in the experiences of subjects belonging to a "community", then "we" in that community "constitute" objects in our "world" through those shared meanings (pp. 77-80). Here is the fundamental structure of intersubjectivity. And empathy is the crucial link that binds my and your experience together, as we join together as "persons" in a given "community" (pp. 66-7). As McIntyre reconstructs Husserl's account of the "constitution" of objects and persons and communities, he draws carefully from Husserl's Ideas II (1912), Cartesian Meditations (1931), and Crisis (1935-38). Many Husserl exegetes have seen in the Meditations a retreat into a radical idealism, as Husserl wrestled with "transcendental solipsism". McIntyre shows, to the contrary, how the Meditations joins earlier and later texts in analyzing the role of empathy in our intersubjective "constitution" of objective realities of nature and social community.

Other essays in the volume pursue further issues of intersubjectivity. Suffice it to say that this volume offers much food for thought, traversing different fields of philosophy and different eras in the history of philosophy. It affords an instructive metaphilosophical perspective on how we may integrate philosophical ideas and methods that cut across these different domains, theoretical and historical. Highly recommended reading!


Husserl, Edmund. 1912/1989. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, Second Book: Studies in the Phenomenology of Constitution. Translated by Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer. Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, now Springer. Original text from 1912. Called Ideas II.

Smith, Adam. 1750/2002. The Theory of Moral Sentiments. Edited by Knud Haakonssen. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002. Originally published in 1750.

Smith, David Woodruff. 1989. The Circle of Acquaintance: Perception, Consciousness, and Empathy. Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, now Springer.

Smith, David Woodruff. 2007. Husserl. London and New York: Routledge. Second, revised edition, 2013.