Intricate Ethics: Rights, Responsibilities, and Permissible Harm

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F.M. Kamm, Intricate Ethics: Rights, Responsibilities, and Permissible Harm, Oxford University Press, 2007, 520pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195189698.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Brand-Ballard, George Washington University




Reading F.M. Kamm's latest book is like watching a brilliant astronomer map an uncharted galaxy.  The details are often difficult to follow, but the meticulosity and the display of mental stamina must inspire awe.  There is a kind of beauty in the performance alone.  Intricate Ethics is a major event in normative ethical theory by a living master of the subject.[1]  Its innovations may not receive as much attention as they deserve.

 The book collects and partially integrates Kamm's theoretical work published since 1996.[2]  All chapters are based on previously published papers, but most are expanded and revised.  The intended readers are professionals who are already familiar with the literature on the Trolley Problem, the Doctrine of Double Effect, aggregation, innocent attackers, et cetera.

A commentary of this length could be devoted to almost any single page of this extraordinarily dense opus, so my goals in this review are modest: to identify the topics addressed in each chapter and to raise some concerns about Kamm's program.  Some aspects of her work could have the unintended effect of pushing away readers.  These aspects include her writing style, her way of using moral intuitions, and her reluctance to entertain broad objections to her methodology.



The first section (“Nonconsequentialism and the Trolley Problem”) includes six chapters.  Chapter 1 (“Nonconsequentialism”) provides a pleasantly compact introduction to Kamm's project, largely summarizing points made in Morality, Mortality (1993; 1996).  In short, Kamm makes a patient-centered, rather than an agent-centered, case for deontological restrictions on harming.  In Chapter 2 (“Aggregation and Two Moral Methods”), Kamm addresses how to take into account the number of imperiled people one can help when one cannot help everyone.  She engages T.M. Scanlon's work on this topic and responds at length to objections raised by Michael Otsuka.  Chapter 3 (“Intention, Harm, and the Possibility of a Unified Theory”) is based on Kamm's review of Warren Quinn's Morality and Action (1993).  She challenges Quinn's revised versions of the Doctrines of Double Effect and of Doing and Allowing.

Chapters 4 and 5 concentrate on many variations of the Trolley Problem.  In Chapter 4 (“The Doctrines of Double and Triple Effect and Why a Rational Agent Need Not Intend the Means to His End”), Kamm draws an important distinction between doing something in order, or intending, to bring about something else and doing something because of something else that will be brought about. (p. 92)  She challenges the familiar principle that a rational agent must intend the means to his end and introduces the Doctrine of Triple Effect (DTE), stating:

A greater good that we cause and whose expected existence is a condition of our action, but which we do not necessarily intend, may justify a lesser evil* that we must not intend but may have as a condition of action. (p. 118)[3]

The DTE explains why it is impermissible to push an innocent bystander in front of a trolley in order to prevent it from killing five, whereas it is permissible to reverse the trolley in the Loop Case, whereby one sends it around a loop and it stops against one person, without whom it would otherwise have continued around the loop, hitting five others (the same five whom it would have hit had one not reversed it in the first place).  Kamm defends the DTE as a successor to the Doctrine of Double Effect (which she finds indefensible in all its versions).  The fifth chapter, the most theoretically intensive, is “Toward the Essence of Nonconsequentialist Constraints on Harming.”  In this chapter, Kamm presents her new master doctrine of permissible harm, the Doctrine of Productive Purity (DPP).  The DPP absorbs and supplants the DTE and the Principle of Permissible Harm, which readers may remember from Kamm's earlier work.  The DPP has two clauses:

(1) If an evil* cannot be at least initially sufficiently justified, it cannot be justified by the greater good that it is necessary (given our act) to causally produce.  However, such an evil* can be justified by the greater good whose component(s) cause it, even if the evil* is causally necessary to help sustain the greater good or its components.

(2) In order for an act to be permissible, it should be possible for any evil* side effect (except possibly indirect side effects) of what we do, or evil* causal means that we must use (given our act) to bring about the greater good, to be at least the effect of a [greater good that] is working itself out (or the effect of means that are noncausally related to that greater good that is working itself out). (p. 164)[4]

Chapters 7-9 discuss the nature and significance of moral status and moral rights, applying several distinctions drawn in the first five chapters.  These chapters defend, among other claims, the view that rights have significance beyond their role in protecting our interests.  Rights reflect our inviolable status as persons.  Imagine moral principles that permit an agent to violate the negative rights of one bystander, Joe, in order to prevent the negative rights of Jim and Susan from being similarly violated.  Kamm argues that Joe, Jim, and Susan all have lower, more “violable,” moral status under these principles than they would have under Kamm's principles, which forbid violating Joe's negative rights.  Kamm's principles give Jim and Susan a higher, more inviolable moral status, even as their negative rights are violated.  For Kamm, the moral status possessed by all human beings, as such, is not a function of what actually happens to them.  It is a function of what it is, in fact, permissible to do to them.  Better that we be “dead, but inviolable” than “alive, but violable,” it seems.[5]

In Chapter 10 (“Responsibility and Collaboration”), Kamm presents her own solutions to the famous cases of “Jim and the Indians” and “George the Chemist,” introduced by Bernard Williams (1973).  She applies her findings to the appropriateness of agent regret and to some issues in medical ethics.

In Chapters 11 and 12 (“Does Distance Matter Morally to the Duty to Rescue?” and “The New Problem of Distance in Morality”) Kamm rethinks the moral significance of the distance between potential rescuers and imperiled strangers.  One point of notable originality concerns the philosophical costs of denying that distance matters.  According to Kamm, one who denies that distance matters must reject a whole range of common intuitions according to which an agent has relatively greater responsibility to rescue victims or neutralize threats that are physically near to him, or to instrumentalities that he controls. (p. 379)

In the final section, Kamm turns a critical eye on Peter Singer's utilitarianism (Ch. 13) and Bernard Gert's moral theory (Ch. 15).  Chapter 16 reprints her splendid review essay on T.M. Scanlon (1998), “Owing, Justifying, and Rejecting.”  She shows decisively how Scanlon's contractualism presupposes (rather than supporting the view) that distinctions such as doing/allowing have the moral significance attributed to them by standard deontology (a conclusion reached independently, but published later, in Brand-Ballard [2004]).



I now turn to some reservations about Kamm's project.


Kamm's aim in most chapters of Intricate Ethics is to identify principles that reflect her own moral intuitions.  Her method is to describe a hypothetical case, to report her own intuitions about the permissibility of different actions in that situation, and to adjust her principles to accommodate the intuitions with which she finds herself.  She recognizes that “intuitive support is not enough to justify a principle of morality.” (p. 346)  Ultimately, philosophers must examine the principles themselves, to see if they “express[] some plausible value or conception of the person or relations between persons.” (p. 5)  Nevertheless, Intricate Ethics makes little progress at this final stage (there are bits on pp. 164-69 and 379-86).  Some readers will find this limitation disappointing, although philosophers should not be expected to do everything at once.  Kamm is a methodical thinker and she is still largely occupied with formulating her principles, not defending them.


As a methodological matter, Kamm believes that her moral intuitions about hypothetical cases remain reliable even when the cases become extremely unrealistic.  I happen to support and enjoy the philosophical use of unrealistic hypotheticals, so I mention this aspect of Kamm's work merely to warn readers who become impatient with thought experiments involving fantastic coincidences, strange machines, remote control devices, stipulated causal connections with no causal mechanism described, serums that miraculously revive the dead (p. 155), people with arms long enough to span India (p. 352), and human beings who are miles wide (p. 355).  If such fantasies bore you, or you doubt that our reactions to them are informative, then this book is not for you.


Kamm claims to “share and take seriously the everyday intuitions we have.” (Voorhoeve 2006).  She treats her own intuitions as moral data, as do many philosophers.  In defense of this method, she mentions the experimental work of Harvard psychologist, Marc Hauser, as suggesting that “the same deep structure is present in all persons.”  If Hauser were correct, then “considering the intuitive judgements of one person would be sufficient, for each person would give the same response.” (p. 8)  However, although Hauser's (2006) experiments confirm the existence of certain basic deontological intuitions, they do not test for all of the intuitions to which Kamm appeals in this book.  Kamm does not claim otherwise, but she sometimes seems to slide from the observed near-universality of some deontological intuitions to the conclusion that everyone would share her intuitions about the complicated cases she invents, if only he would reflect upon them as carefully as she has.

Of course, one should not begrudge a philosopher a few appeals to her own intuitions, but Kamm makes these appeals with a vengeance.  This is especially worrisome because she so often draws moral distinctions between cases that others might see as morally indistinguishable.  Her intuitions are exquisitely sensitive to the specific physical properties of trolleys, bombs, bridges, pills, knives, doctors, transplanted organs, sore throats, headaches, bathtubs, Lazy Susans, life-support machines, snow shovels, islands, yachts, et cetera.  Here I paraphrase just a few of the dozens of intuitions that Kamm expects her readers to treat as fixed data points in moral reflection, not as controversial conclusions needing defense:

1. It is permissible to drive on a road in order to deliver five dying people to the hospital, although driving on the road causes vibrations that topple rocks at the roadside, killing one bystander; whereas, it is impermissible to drive to the hospital with the dying people on a road of loosely packed rocks that are thereby dislodged and tumble, killing one bystander. (p. 149)

2. It is permissible to redirect a runaway trolley onto a track, where one person happens to lie, in order to prevent it from fatally striking many people on the other track; whereas, it is impermissible to redirect the trolley onto a track, where one person happens to lie, in order to prevent it from destroying a tool on the other track, a tool needed to save many lives. (p. 166)

3. If the trolley was originally headed toward five people and is redirected toward another person, then that person is permitted to save himself by redirecting the trolley back toward the five; whereas, he may not so redirect the trolley if it was originally headed toward him. (p. 167)

4. A tactical bomber is permitted to bomb a munitions factory in a just war, knowing that the vibrations will collapse the roof of an adjacent school, which will kill children; whereas, he is not permitted to bomb the factory if pieces of the bomb itself will fly off into the school and kill the children. (p. 175)

Kamm is exceptionally good at inventing hypothetical cases that isolate the factors that interest her, and she has a similarly prodigious talent for identifying and characterizing those factors in general terms.  She has yet to discover in herself an intuition for which she cannot formulate a covering principle.  However, I am not sure why anyone with Kamm's level of confidence in her own moral intuitions about difficult cases would need to contemplate general moral principles in the first place.[6]


Notwithstanding Kamm's faith in a universal moral sense, her method authorizes her to study herself, alone.  This means that one cannot appreciate the many virtues of Intricate Ethics unless one is prepared to be charitable – to accept that Kamm's intuitions are correct, arguendo.  Therefore, it is especially surprising that Kamm does not extend to those whom she criticizes the same charity that she demands of her own readers.  For example, in Chapter 6, an otherwise forceful critique of Peter Unger (1996), Kamm abruptly reports that she does not have the intuitions that Unger expects his readers to have about cases (pp. 198-99).  She proceeds to criticize him on that basis.  In such instances, it would be helpful to know how many people share Kamm's intuitions as opposed to Unger's.  Kamm simply insists that “progress” can be made without such information (pp. 5, 199).  She forges ahead.


Perhaps the more basic question about intuitions, however, is not whether most of us share Kamm's intuitions, but how many people would continue to share them after prolonged existence in a very different possible world.  Kamm seems uninterested in the possibility that our current moral intuitions might reflect various contextual contingencies of the world in which we live (this despite her having pioneered a Principle of Contextual Interaction for morally relevant factors [p. 17]).

Consider the common moral intuitions used by Kamm and other deontologists to support the principle that killing a stranger is harder to justify than letting one die.  Would people still have these intuitions if they lived in a world in which opportunities to rescue had always been more common and profitable than opportunities to kill?  In our world, profitable opportunities to kill are more common, by several orders of magnitude, than profitable opportunities to let die.  Every day I have thousands of opportunities to kill and strong incentives to do so (it would be nice to have rivals out of the way!).  Whereas, I have never been in a situation in which I was uniquely positioned to save a stranger's life, much less a situation in which I could greatly advance my interests by failing to save someone.  So imagine a world in which each of us, every day, confronts an opportunity to rescue a stranger from drowning, and could profit from failing to do so, but one almost never has the opportunity and incentive to kill.  In our world, much human life would be unjustifiably lost if people considered killing easy to justify.  The fact that people consider failing to rescue somewhat easier to justify than killing does not have such disastrous consequences, in our world.  Whereas, the opposite would hold in the alternate world just described.  I do not believe that we would still consider killing to be more difficult to justify than letting die if we lived in that world.

Kamm uses her formidable imagination to consider outrageously unrealistic hypothetical scenarios, but she does not consider what her intuitions might be if she had lived in other possible worlds.  I am not sure her indifference to such counterfactual intuitions comports with her ambition to identify ultimate, universal moral principles, rather than derivative, local ones.


I can also imagine the social and natural sciences supplying persuasive “debunking explanations” for the deontic intuitions to which Kamm appeals.  For example, some of my deontic intuitions may be explicable as heuristics that are highly adaptive in statistically normal situations, but that misfire in unusual situations, as when pushing one man in front of the trolley is necessary to save five.  Kamm does not, apparently, take principled objection to the project of offering an error theory to account for recalcitrant moral intuitions (pp. 188n92, 379-85).  She is merely unimpressed with all such efforts to date.  In Chapter 13, she blocks Peter Singer's attempt to offer a debunking evolutionary explanation of our intuitions in the standard Trolley Problem.[7] (pp. 417-18)  She is still more persuasive in Chapter 14, where she criticizes debunking explanations inspired by the experiments supporting Prospect Theory (first conducted by Amos Tversky and Nobel laureate Daniel Kahneman).  Kamm rebuts the inference that these experiments undermine the moral significance of the harming/not-aiding distinction.  She makes a powerful case that Tversky and Kahneman are too quick to assimilate the harming/not-aiding distinction to the loss/no-gain distinction.  Psychologists trying to demonstrate the irrationality of deontological reasoning would be wise to design their experiments with Kamm's critique in mind.

There are, of course, bad debunking explanations, and Kamm shows that successful ones are harder to produce than some have thought.  Still, one cannot be confident that better explanations will never be given.  I remain optimistic that they will be.[8]

One might also be concerned that Kamm focuses exclusively on deontic intuitions.  Suppose I have the deontic intuition that it is wrong to push one bystander onto the tracks as a means to save five.  I would not give my deontic intuitions as much authority as Kamm gives hers, because my deontic intuitions about such cases are in tension with my teleological intuitions.  I have teleological intuitions that losing a leg (or life) is bad, and that two people losing legs because they happen to be on the trolley tracks is about twice as bad as one person losing a leg because he is pushed onto the tracks.  I have much more subjective confidence in these teleological intuitions than I have in my deontic intuition that pushing the bystander is impermissible.  If I am pressed to justify my deontic intuition, I find myself unable to do so, yet the feeling remains that some further justification is needed.  Whereas, if I am pressed to justify my teleological intuitions, I can do no more than point to concrete facts about the pain and loss of function associated with losing limbs.  No deeper justification seems required, or possible.

It is also much harder for me to imagine debunking explanations for my teleological intuitions than for my deontic intuitions.  Perhaps empirical research could cast doubt on my teleological intuition that pain and loss for two people is intrinsically worse than pain and loss for one, but I see little prospect of this.


Kamm casts herself as a defender of ordinary morality against the radical revisionism of contemporary “left-wing” consequentialists such as Singer and Unger.  She can be a bit rough with their ilk.  Here she is in a recent interview (Voorhoeve 2006):

I tend to think that some of the philosophers who think that we have very large positive duties, but don't live up to them, are not really serious.  … There must be something wrong with that theory, or else there is something wrong with its proponents.

However, Kamm cannot plausibly insist that she is merely standing up for an old-fashioned common sense that anyone but a benighted consequentialist would accept.  Many prominent nonconsequentialists do not share all of her intuitions or the philosophical lessons that she derives from them.  Disputes arise with Thomas Nagel (pp. 4-5), Elizabeth Anscombe (pp. 51-52), Warren Quinn (Ch. 3), Christine Korsgaard (p. 110), Michael Otsuka (pp. 70-73), and Judith Jarvis Thomson (p. 123 n.5).  These philosophers are hardly critics of common-sense morality.  To be sure, Singer and Unger defend jarringly unfamiliar conclusions about our duties to needy strangers, but Kamm's views are idiosyncratic in a different way.


Kamm observes that, in many situations, “consequentialism” permits or requires actions that her moral intuitions condemn.  She appears to reject all consequentialist theories for that reason, but rarely attempts to demonstrate conflicts with anything but a simple version of utilitarianism.  She does not ask whether her principles could be supported by other versions of consequentialism.  She challenges Singer in Chapter 13, but makes no reference to other recent formulations of consequentialism: rule (Hooker 2000), sophisticated (Railton 1984), global (Pettit and Smith 2000; Kagan 2000), or scalar (Norcross 1997).  It is also disappointing that Kamm does not respond directly in Intricate Ethics to some critics of her earlier arguments (e.g., Harris 2000; Lippert-Rasmussen 1996, 1999).[9]


Finally, I turn to the issue of writing style.  The difficulty of Kamm's prose is well known.  However, in one important sense she is an exemplary philosophical writer: her sentences state her meaning precisely.  Rarely is she vague.  The problem is that she packs more thoughts into each paragraph than most readers can track at a normal reading pace.  Nor does she “hold the reader's hand” very often.  Time and again one squints at sentences such as this:

Someone who does not aid, while intending harm or involvement leading to harm, shows a lack of respect for authority over the self by taking it as a factor in favor of a state of affairs that it involves interference with, or other harmful involvement of, someone without his consent. (p. 87)

One must be prepared to reread.  I know philosophers who are sincerely interested in Kamm's topics, and who could learn much from her, but who refuse to tackle her books.  This is regrettable.  I do not know whether Kamm's points could be made easier for the reader to follow without loss of content.  Kamm appears disinclined to try, and I would hate to see her “dumb down” her thinking for the sake of accessibility.  I am happy to report that I found this book easier to read than the two volumes of Morality, Mortality (1993; 1996).  It helps that, although the chapters refer to one another, each remains intelligible as a stand-alone essay.



In the end, professional moral philosophers cannot reasonably ignore Intricate Ethics, despite its quirks and limitations.  Kamm continues to prove herself the most imaginative, detail-oriented deontologist writing in English today.  Even readers who do not share her intuitions will come away from the book inspired to formulate principles that capture their own, and she will have provided them with dozens of new philosophical resources for doing so.  Professor Kamm is in a class by herself.



Brand-Ballard, Jeffrey. (2004). “Contractualism and Deontic Restrictions.” Ethics, 114, pp. 269-300.

Dancy, Jonathan. (2004). Ethics without Principles. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Harris, John. (2000). “The Moral Difference Between Throwing a Trolley at a Person and Throwing a Person at a Trolley.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary, 74, pp. 41-57.

Hauser, Marc. (2006). Moral Minds: How Nature Designed Our Universal Sense of Right and Wrong. (New York: HarperCollins).

Hooker, Brad. (2000). Ideal Code, Real World: A Rule-consequentialist Theory of Morality. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Kagan, Shelly. (2000). “Evaluative Focal Points.” In Brad Hooker et al, eds., Morality, Rules, and Consequences. (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press).

Kamm, F.M. (1993). Morality, Mortality, vol. I: Death and Whom to Save from It .(Oxford: Oxford University Press).

______. (1996). Morality, Mortality, vol. II: Rights, Duties, and Status. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Lippert-Rasmussen, Kasper. (1999). “In What Way Are Constraints Paradoxical?”  Utilitas, 11, pp. 49-70.

______. (1996). “Moral Status and the Impermissibility of Minimizing Violations.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 25, pp. 333-350.

Norcross, Alasdair. (1997). “Good and Bad Actions.” Philosophical Review, 106, pp. 1-34.

Pettit, Philip and Michael Smith. (2000). “Global Consequentialism.” In Brad Hooker et al, eds., Morality, Rules, and Consequences. (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press).

Quinn, Warren. (1993). Morality and Action. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press). 

Railton, Peter. (1984). “Alienation, Consequentialism, and the Demands of Morality.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 13, pp. 134-171.

Scanlon, T.M. (1998). What We Owe to Each Other. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

Singer, Peter. (2005). “Ethics and Intuitions.” Journal of Ethics, 9, pp. 331-52.

Unger, Peter. (1996). Living High and Letting Die: Our Illusion of Innocence. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Valdesolo, Piercarlo and David DeSteno. (2006). “Manipulations of Emotional Context Shape Moral Judgment.” Psychological Science, 17, pp. 476-77.

Voorhoeve, Alex. (2006). “In Search of the Deep Structure of Morality. An Interview with Frances Kamm.” Imprints, 9, pp. 93-117.

Williams, Bernard. (1973). “A Critique of Utilitarianism.” In J.J.C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

[1]Citations in this review are to the reviewed work unless otherwise noted.

[2]A separate volume will collect her work in applied ethics.

[3]Kamm defines evil* as “evil or involvement of a person without his consent when foreseeably this will lead to an evil to him.” (p. 133)

[4]This passage contains a typographical error which my bracketed text corrects.

[5]See also p. 417.

[6]See Dancy (2004).

[7]Kamm cites a conference paper subsequently published as Singer (2005).

[8]A recent psychological experiment suggests that subjects in happy states of mind are more willing to push a bystander onto the trolley tracks to save lives. (Valdesolo & DeSteno 2006)

[9]Harris (2000) was published alongside the paper that appears as Chapter 4 of Intricate Ethics.  Kamm cites Lippert-Rasmussen (1996) on p. 184n58.