Introducing Analytic Philosophy: Its Sense and Its Nonsense 1879-2002

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Hochberg, Herbert, Introducing Analytic Philosophy: Its Sense and Its Nonsense 1879-2002, Dr. Hansel-Hohenhausen, 2003, 280pp, '40.00 (hbk), ISBN 3826712307.

Reviewed by Richard Mendelsohn , CUNY


Professor Hochberg’s book is best characterized by his own words from the preface:

The book attempts to sketch, not work out in detail, an account of reference, meaning, truth and intentionality that stays within the “linguistic turn” characterizing twentieth century analytic philosophy. But it seeks to avoid following the contemporary variants of analytic philosophy that have turned from the analysis of things and facts to a preoccupation with and virtual worship of language and its use. The classical focus on ontology, combined with careful and precise formulations, that marked the writings of the early founders of the analytic tradition, has degenerated into the spinning of intricate verbal webs of analysis. The latter supposedly yield “theories of meaning” but more often signal the rebirth of idealism in the guises of “anti-realism” and “internal realism.” The focus on the world, as what words are about, is often lost as “analytic philosophers” concentrate on language itself—the world being “well lost,” in Nelson Goodman’s honest words… . We shall also note examples of a remarkable combination of arrogance towards and ignorance of the philosophical tradition that is displayed in some writings within the analytic tradition, including influential works.

Contrary to its title, this book is not intended to introduce analytic philosophy to the reader. A considerably sophisticated understanding of the field and its primary literature is presupposed. Nor does this book purport to present a scholarly and dispassionate critical exposition of the views. It is very much idiosyncratic and opinionated. Hochberg finds huge swaths of analytic philosophy irrelevant and empty. To be sure, he discusses Frege, Bradley, Russell, Meinong, Strawson, Tarski, Carnap, Searle, Donnellan, Kripke, Davidson, Dummett, and Quine. But he is unhappy with the way in which the modern generations of analytic philosophers have cut themselves loose from their roots, which, by the way, he traces to Meinong and Bradley as well as to Frege, Moore, Russell and Wittgenstein. Hochberg has absolutely no sympathy with those components of the linguistic turn inspired by the later Wittgenstein, by the Ordinary Language philosophers, by those investigating the logico/linguistic mechanisms of reference, and even those elaborating the work of Sellars. Kripke? “Kripke hasn’t discovered anything at all” (p. 139).

Hochberg’s treatment of Frege reflects his bias. Here are the first two sentences of the book:

Frege ingeniously used a few basic ideas to attempt to resolve a number of fundamental philosophical problems. Like Bradley, he saw a problem in the analysis of predicative judgments that led to holding that the existence of facts grounded their truth and falsity. (p. 19)

It is appropriate to begin the story about analytic philosophy with Frege. But Frege, for most of his philosophical career, had little to say about the grounding of truth and falsity; and when he did finally address the issue, he found little to like. Facts are, for him, simply true thoughts; and their role in the service of a correspondence theory as grounders of truth is rejected. Frege did confront an issue that has echoes in Bradley about the unity of complex entities. Frege held that a complex whole must decompose into at least one incomplete part. Important as this was, Frege never connected this problem with the grounding of truth. The complete/incomplete distinction was more intimately connected with his function/argument analysis and its attendant compositionality principles—arguably his most significant contribution to philosophy, but one about which Hochberg has little directly to say. Viewing Frege through Hochberg’s prism yields a distorted picture.1

Hochberg is interested primarily in an ontology that is out of fashion, most specifically, the way in which the various components constitute the states of affairs that ground truth. A typical topic that garners space and passion is the existence of negative facts. Because he is out of step with the temper of the times, Hochberg tends to be grumpy and dismissive. But, and this is the point I would like to underscore, it is worth the reader’s time and effort to figure out what he is up to, for there are philosophical rewards to be found.

By way of example, I will consider his extended discussion (pp 182-92) of Davidson’s “Great Fact argument,” as he calls it. Hochberg, if it is not already clear to the reader, is partial to the correspondence theory and to facts. Davidson is highly dubious of both.

The real objection to correspondence theories is simpler; it is that there is nothing for true sentences to correspond to. The point was made long ago by C. I. Lewis; he challenged the correspondence theorist to locate the fact or part of reality, or of the world, to which a true sentence corresponded… . Following out this line of thought led Lewis to conclude that if true sentences correspond to anything at all, it must be the universe as a whole; thus all true sentences correspond to the same thing. Frege, as we know, independently reached the same conclusion through a similar course of reasoning. Frege’s argument, if Alonzo Church is right, can be formalized … . [Davidson 2001: 103]. Quoted by Hochberg, pp.182-3.

Hochberg’s evaluation of the project is characteristically intemperate:

Davidson’s argument against facts is without substance or, perhaps, even content. Be that as it may, … I will briefly consider [the Great Fact argument against facts] since many still discuss what is clearly a pointless argument … . (p. 184)

He is not the first, and he is not the only, philosopher to criticize Davidson’s argument;2 but he offers a perspective others have not noticed.

Davidson’s argument traces its provenance to [Frege 1892]’s argument that the truth-values are objects named by declarative sentences. The crucial element of Frege’s argument is a substitution principle for reference. Where d(η) is the denotation of η, Φα a complex containing the singular term α, and Φα/β the result of replacing α at one or more of its occurrences by β, we have:

[The Substitution Principle] If d(α)=d(β), then d(Φα)=d(Φα/β)

The True and the False, Frege argued, are the only objects that are compositionally related by this principle to the denotation of the parts of the sentence, and which, in turn, are compositionally related to the denotation of larger constructions in which the sentence is embedded.

In Chapter 0, perhaps the best formal introduction to Fregean semantics, [Church 1956] presented a beautiful version of Frege’s argument. He begins with the true sentence

(1) Sir Walter Scott is the man who wrote twenty-nine Waverley novels altogether.

and paraphrases it as

(2) The number, such that Sir Walter Scott is the man who wrote that many Waverley novels altogether, is twenty-nine.

(2), if not synonymous with (1), is “at least so nearly so as to ensure its having the same reference.” But the following is also, it seems, true:

(3) The number of counties in Utah is twenty-nine.

Things equal to the same are equal to each other. So, substituting one term for the other in (2), we get

(4) The number of counties in Utah is twenty-nine,

which must also be true, and which, via compositionality, denotes the same thing as (1). In the transformational series from (1) to (4), the proposition expressed has changed completely. What remains invariant? Truth-value.

Here, now, is Davidson’s formalization of [Church 1956]’s argument by way of [Gödel 1944].3 Assume that any two logically equivalent sentences have the same denotation, and also that we have a definite description operator, say, Russell’s iota-operator. Let “S” and “T” be two sentences that agree in truth-value. Consider the sequence

(5) S
(6) (ix)(x=x × S) = (ix)(x=x)
(7) (ix)(x=x × T) = (ix)(x=x)
(8) T

(5) and (6) are logically equivalent. They have the same denotation. Similarly for (7) and (8). Only (6) and (7) remain. We get (7) from (6) by replacing “(ix)(x=x × S)” by “(ix)(x=x × T).” Since “S” and “T” have the same truth-value, these two singular terms have the same denotation. So, by compositionality, (6) and (7) must have the same denotation too. Assuming that sentences denote, then, any two sentences agreeing in truth-value must denote the same thing.

Enter Hochberg. He finds Davidson’s argument wanting. To dramatize his point, he sets forth an argument schema he calls Dav:

(8) S
(9) T
(10) “S” designates S
(11) “S” designates T

It would be “absurd,” says Hochberg, to infer (11) from (8), (9) and (10) alone. Something more is required. He is right. (8) and (9) would sanction the substitution in (10) to get (11) only if the context “S” designates were truth-functional. That’s what needs to be established. But Davidson only shows that however much we transform the sentence “S” using the traditional engines that are thought to preserve denotation—(1) paraphrase, (2) substitution of synonymous sentences, (3) substitution of logically equivalent sentences, or (4) substitution of codenotational singular terms—truth-value remains invariant. He never shows that the context in which the sentence “S” occurs is truth-functional.

The cogency of Hochberg’s insight is immediate in [Quine 1953]’s variant which was designed to cast doubt on the coherence of quantified modal logic. We use the usual symbol “” for Necessarily. As before, we assume “S” and “T” have the same truth-value, but, in addition, we assume that when “S” and “T” are logically equivalent, “S” and “T” have the same truth-value. We preface each step of Davidson’s argument with a “”:

(12) S
(13)  (ix)(x=x × S) = (ix)(x=x)
(14)  (ix)(x=x × T) = (ix)(x=x)
(15) T

Since (12) and (13) are logically equivalent, they have the same truth-value. Similarly for (14) and (15). Lastly, we get (14) from (13) by substituting “(ix)(x=x × T)” for the codenotational “(ix)(x=x × S),” so (13) and (14) must have the same truth-value. We have our conclusion: when “S” and “T” have the same truth-value, “S” and “T” have the same truth-value, i.e., “” is a truth-functional operator.

But the argument must fail. “” is clearly not truth-functional. The problem can be traced to a scope ambiguity in (13). If the description is given wide scope, the substitution is legitimate. But if it is given narrow scope, the substitution is legitimate only if in addition the overarching context—in this case, “”—is truth-functional.4 In sanctioning the substitution, whatever the scope, Quine is simply assuming the context is truth functional. The argument is little more than Hochberg’s Dav.

Hochberg’s presentation of Davidson’s argument is like Quine’s, but with “S” designates in front of each of Davidson’s steps:

(16) “S” designates S
(17) “S” designates (ix)(x=x × S) = (ix)(x=x)
(18) “S” designates (ix)(x=x × T) = (ix)(x=x)
(19) “S” designates T

The reasoning is exactly the same as in Quine’s; and the question-begging assumption is exactly the same. Hochberg’s presentation drives the point home. Here is how Hochberg puts it:

If descriptions are treated along the lines of Russell’s theory of definite descriptions, then the descriptive phrases are contextually defined signs. Therefore, we should expand them to examine the argument. If we attempt to do so an immediate problem arises about the scope of descriptions in contexts like [(17)] and [(18)]. Putting that aside, we take the scope(s) as “secondary,” just governing the sentential expression after the occurrence of “designates.” If one expands the definite descriptions in [the sentences of the argument] it becomes immediately obvious that there is no way to get to [(18)] unless one is allowed to replace an occurrence of “S” by an occurrence of “T.” … Gödel had pointed out quite early that one cannot simply reason along lines Davidson employs … if one employs a definite descriptive operator as a contextually defined sign in Russell’s manner and not as a primitive sign pattern… . But to replace an occurrence of “S” by an occurrence of “T” is to use a different rule, one concerning sentences that merely have the same truth value but are not “logically equivalent” sentences. Thus, … we can simply argue Dav. (pp. 185-6)

Hochberg does not address the remaining puzzling conflict between the use of the function d(h) in the Substitution Principle and the role of designates in the expanded Davidson argument. The solution, I believe, lies in the fact that the Substitution Principle fails—notoriously so. Only if the context in which the complex is situated is truth-functional does it hold. But a full discussion is beyond the purview of this review.

[Davidson 1969]’s name “Great Fact” evokes Gödel’s observation that Frege “meant” that all true sentences denote the same thing “in an almost metaphysical sense, reminding one somewhat of the Eleatic doctrine of the “One”” [Gödel 1944: 450]. Although Davidson (as well as Quine) duly note their debt to Gödel, they both fail to explicitly acknowledge the significance Gödel saw in his precising of Frege’s argument: it was (a) to bring to the light its reliance on definite descriptions, and (b) to reveal that [Russell 1905]’s treatment of descriptions, unlike [Frege 1892]’s, provided the basis for thwarting Frege’s conclusion. Davidson and Quine appropriated part (a) of Gödel’s story, but ignored part (b). Hochberg has good reason to be a bit intemperate!

Hochberg’s critique of the argument is quite penetrating, and typical of the high quality of his philosophical insights. But the reader must look closely at his words, overlook infelicities, ex cathedra pronouncements and grumpiness, and be able to fill in details—many of them sophisticated and difficult philosophical steps—to put them to work.


[Barwise 1981] Barwise, J. and Perry, J., “Semantic Innocence and Uncompromising Situations,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy VI (1981) 387—404.

[Beaney 1997] Beaney, M., The Frege Reader, Blackwell Publishers, Oxford, 1997.

[Church 1956] Church, A., Introduction to Mathematical Logic, vol. I, Princeton University Press, Princeton, 1956.

[Davidson 1969] Davidson, D., “True to the Facts,” The Journal of Philosophy 66 (1969) 748-764.

[Davidson 2001] Davidson, D., Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 2001.

[Frege 1879] Frege, G., Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Verlag von L. Nebert, Halle, 1879. Preface and Part I translated in [Beaney 1997: 47-78].

[Frege 1892] Frege, G., “Uber Sinn und Bedeutung,” Zeitschrift fñ°Ÿhilosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892) 25-50. Translated as “On Sinn and Bedeutung” in [Beaney 1997: 151-171].

[Gödel 1944] Gödel K., “Russell’s Mathematical Logic.” Reprinted in H. Putnam and P. Benacerraf eds., Philosophy of Mathematics, Selected Readings, Second edition, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1983, pp. 447-469.

[Quine 1953] Quine, W. V. O., “Reference and Modality.” From a Logical Point of View, 2nd ed. rev., Harper and Row, New York, 1961, pp. 136-159.

[Russell 1905] Russell, B., “On Denoting,” Mind 14 (1905) 479-93.

[Smullyan 1948] Smullyan, A. F., “Modality and Description,” The Journal of Symbolic Logic 13 (1948) 31-37.


1. Incidentally, Hochberg insists that Frege regarded concepts as ingredients of thoughts. This is wrong. Frege regarded a concept as the referent of a concept-word, not what it expresses. Hochberg offers no textual support for his reading.

2. Of particular significance is [Barwise 1981], who charge, in effect, a fallacy of equivocation.

3. This version is taken from [Davidson 1969], but using definite descriptions instead of class abstracts.

4. [Smullyan 1948] helped clarify this aspect of Russell’s treatment of descriptions.