Introduction to Antiphilosophy

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Boris Groys, Introduction to Antiphilosophy, David Fernbach (tr.), Verso, 2012, 248pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781844677566.

Reviewed by John Mullarkey, Kingston University, London


Boris Groys' Introduction to Antiphilosophy is not a study of the classical 20th Century anti-philosophies that one associates with the work of the Vienna circle, Wittgenstein, or Popper. When it does examine the major figures of philosophy, its investigations belong exclusively to the 'continental' side -- Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Derrida. Nor is it 'introductory' in the sense of systematically setting out the fundamental principles and common strategies of anti-philosophy (in relativism, skepticism, nihilism, or pluralism), be they historical or contemporary examples. Groys' Introduction to Antiphilosophy is both something more and less than these other, possible books. What it is reflects its author's research as an art critic and media theorist who is best known for writing The Total Art of Stalinism (1992). As such, even the names of the continental philosophers cited above only appear in four of the volume's eleven essays, the others examining a more eclectic list of figures arising from Groys' own field in the modern history of ideas of Germany and Russia (Gotthold Ephraim Lessing, Leo Shestov, Theodor Lessing, Ernst Jünger, Richard Wagner, Vladimir Solovyov, Alexandre Kojève, Mikhail Bakhtin) as well as media theory (Benjamin, Greenberg, McLuhan). The penultimate essay on Hegel, Solovyov and Kojève does concern 'three ends of history', but even this remains mostly within the history of ideas (Solvyov's 'non-philosophical' theory of love and its influence on Kojève and his heirs in the theory of erotics -- Bataille, Lacan, Breton) and does not concern itself so much with the philosophical points being made by each figure with respect to anti-philosophy as such.

This unorthodox approach is avowed right from the start, as is clearly stated in the preface to this English-language translation: 'the texts that are collected in this book were written at different times, for different purposes, in different languages, and initially they were not intended to be read together' (p.vii). Yet, reading them together does give rise to many interesting effects, especially by broadening the scope of what one normally attributes to anti-philosophy beyond the usual suspects of relativism, skepticism, nihilism, or pluralism. As a consequence, the theme of anti-philosophy receives no explicit mention in the majority of the essays, though this is not to say that it is not touched upon, at least tangentially, throughout the volume. Only the first two essays, on Kierkegaard and Shestov, unambiguously tackle anti-philosophy (hence, their position in the book) as any reader would normally understand it.

The fact is that the word 'introduction' carries with it too many pedagogical associations, and Groys' extremely interesting research should be taken more as a prolegomena for any discussion of anti-philosophy in more recognizable terms. Certainly, the title of the Preface to the English edition offers us another key-term that could well act as a leitmotif for the emergence of anti-philosophy in the 20th Century: 'Antiphilosophy, or Philosophical Readymades'. Indeed, the term 'readymade' appears throughout Groys' collection and does, in various kindred ways, emerge within its core argument -- that anti-philosophy is connected to anti-art through the notion of the 'readymade':

I would like to draw some parallels between 'anti-art' and what I call, by analogy, 'antiphilosophy'. The authors I treat in this book can be understood as a ready-made philosophers, by analogy with the ready-made artists. . . . antiphilosophy -- in other words, [is] a ready-made philosophy that ascribes universal philosophical value to certain already existing ordinary practices, in the same way in which practices of the artistic readymade ascribe artistic value to ordinary objects. (pp.viii, xi).

This parallel between art and philosophy draws the project closer to Groys' own field while also facilitating a very productive analogy in the notion of a readymade concept. For both philosophy and art, this is a democratizing project: just as anything can become the object of art -- even a urinal -- given certain conditions of intention (by the artist and/or audience) and reception (by the art institution), so anything can become a worthy object for philosophy:

A traditional philosopher is like a traditional artist: an artisan producing texts. An antiphilosopher is like a contemporary art curator: he contextualizes objects and texts instead of producing them. Production of philosophy can be interpreted as an extraordinary, mysterious, 'poetic' process that is accessible only to a chosen few. Antiphilosophy does not abolish philosophical metanoia, but rather democratizes it. (p.xiii).

The ordinary becomes special, or rather, there is now nothing exceptional about philosophy and its objects: Kierkegaard's Christ, for example, is an ordinary man, and indeed must be an ordinary man (in order to be special), and is, as such, a sort of 'proto-readymade' (p.xii). Likewise, Kojève treats Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit as a readymade with 'his own role as author simply consisting in exhibiting this readymade in a new place -- namely the Paris of his time' (p.100). The connection between this leveling of objects and disciplinary pluralism is clear: in the readymade both art and philosophy renounce their putative exceptionalism as disciplines as well as the heroism of their practitioners. Both subject and object are democratized -- even Absolute Spirit itself is simply a readymade in Kojève's hands (p.162).

For all that there is to enjoy in this argument, Groys is no apologist for anti-philosophy in all its forms, but is simply describing its place within a broader history of ideas, most often connected with the history of art and art theory. That said, one suspects that Groys is actually rather skeptical of the whole enterprise, and especially with regard to some of the more contemporary forms of anti-philosophy that he dubs 'postmodern'. Anti-philosophy, for him, begins with Marx and Kierkegaard, and

does not operate with criticism but rather with command. The command is issued to change the world, instead of explaining it; or to become an animal, instead of continuing to think; or to transform one's own body into a body without organs, and think rhizomically instead of logically. (p.xx)

Groys here displays his own prejudices against postmodernism's epistemological relativism, and a rather poor understanding of Deleuze to boot (Deleuze does not oppose thinking to becoming animal -- he sees the latter as a variant, and indeed more intense, form of thought -- nor the rhizome to logic -- the rhizome, like the animal, has a logic all its own). Indeed, Deleuze is a very poor exemplar of postmodernism, being a champion of both philosophy in general and metaphysics in particular, and so especially opposed to many of the anti-philosophies professed by both analytic and continental thought. Groys himself often seems to conflate metaphysics with philosophy, such that the refusal of the former amounts to a rejection of the latter as well (a highly debatable point). He also remains rather uncritical of his own use of philosophical language, referring to the 'pure logic' of his assertions (pp.114, 125), or 'rational grounds' (p.4) and other critical measures of 'thought' -- versus uncritical valorizations of Life (p.111) -- as though the contested meaning of these terms was not itself at the very heart of the relativist arguments of many anti-philosophers today.

One place where Introduction to Antiphilosophy does engage with a first principle of anti-philosophy is in relation to the terminal status of philosophy (nihilism). This stems from its pluralist, relativist stance: if anything can be philosophical, then there is no further point in practicing philosophy as a privileged enquiry (into truth, with a methodology that offers singular access to evidence) -- philosophy comes to an end. Or at least it should come to an end. This is where at least some of the earlier anti-philosophers that Groys engages with, like Kojève, are more consistent in his eyes. Having preached the 'end of history and thought' in those celebrated Paris seminars throughout the 1930s, Kojève stopped teaching and joined the French civil service. Indeed, according to Groys' reading, Kojève never even taught Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit in the seminars -- 'he merely recites it' (p.163) -- the end of philosophy having already occurred in the 19th Century with the advent of that text.

This point of termination marks another contrast with the contemporary anti-philosophy of the postmoderns, according to Groys. If the likes of Derrida, for example, were consistent in their philosophical nihilism, then they would also renounce their own heroic status as master thinkers and, indeed, the practice itself of the discipline as a transcendental, hegemonic discourse (whether this is fair, at least to Derrida, is a moot point). And yet so many do not retire from the fray -- the wake is never-ending and becomes a necrophilic carnival whose guests refuse to depart. Moreover, the temporality of this choice (to go on philosophizing about the impossibility of philosophy or to perform that end by giving up the discipline) introduces another contrast between the earlier, more consistent forms of modern anti-philosophy and its postmodern, inconsistent (and one suspects too, for Groys, disingenuous) forms. Whereas the modernist says that the end of philosophy has already occurred at some point in the past and whatever appears to be happening now is only pure repetition, the postmodernist argues that the end of philosophy is either about to occur at some future point or is only now occurring in the event of his or her own enunciation. In other words, for a true, consistent, anti-philosophy there must be nothing new, nothing that needs to be taught: everything is always already complete and so there is no need to carry on with philosophy at all. The postmodernist, rather duplicitously, always allows just enough breathing space for his or her own practice to continue.

In its other particulars, Groys' Introduction offers many interesting readings of lesser-known thinkers and so is highly informative on this count alone. The analysis of Shestov outlines his psychological reductionism with great facility, describing his fascinating, albeit implausible, view that every philosopher must have had a traumatic life-event that gave rise to his or her worldview -- Nietzsche's illness, Kierkegaard's (alleged) impotence, etc: 'Philosophy and philosophical reason are in turn always the products of a personal catastrophe, an unrealized demand: philosophy and reason arise after this catastrophe, and not before it.' (p.42). As such, Shestov concludes (in Groys' words), 'only a very few need philosophy: those for whom things are going particularly badly' (p.45). Perhaps this is not so incredible after all.

Groys' essay on Heidegger is not, as one might imagine, on the 'The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking', but instead tackles 'The Origin of the Work of Art'. Here, the emphasis is on a mode of anti-art rather than dealing directly with its analogue in anti-philosophy, the anti-art here being constituted through the world-making power of ordinary objects, taken up and reworked as artful (van Gogh's shoes, and so on). Even though Heidegger still holds to rather traditional artworks as being 'essential' (his choices coming for the most part from the standard Western canon), by the lights of his own theory, any work can be future-oriented (its origins cannot be predicted after all) and so could be essential (pp.66-7). This is a pluralism that, Groys argues, effectively deconstructs any difference between essential and non-essential.

The other essays of particular interest to philosophers of a standard hue are on Derrida and Benjamin. The former treats Derrida's concern with the archive in his essays on apocalyptic thought -- 'Of an Apocalyptic Tone Newly adopted in Philosophy', and 'No Apocalypse, Not Now' (wherein Derrida is said to fictionalize 'everything' (p.78) and so subvert his own anti-realism by being so all-encompassing). The latter presents Benjamin as a theologian of a vanishing past (where only popular cultural reproduction is thereby possible), rather than as a philosopher of a now impossible future enlightenment for the exceptional few (these opposed temporal orientations capturing the essences of the respective disciplines): 'Benjamin's discourse thus presupposes the end of philosophy, insofar as he describes a culture of total reproduction in which philosophy no longer has a place' (p.97). The final essay in the collection is more eclectic again, linking Wagner's 'total work of art' to McLuhan's democratizing media theory, which Groys expands to include the Internet and even participatory art. He also backdates some of these ideas to Gotthold Ephraim Lessing's concerns about the relationship between text, image and mediality, comparing them with both McLuhan's and Greenberg's views on the medium as message, or the image as text and the text as 'readymade' (p.239).

In all its heterogeneous and unorthodox mix, Groys' Introduction is never anything less than fascinating and informative. It is also frequently insightful and will therefore be of great use for both those so-called philosophers and non-philosophers alike.