Introduction to German Philosophy: from Kant to Habermas

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Andrew Bowie, Introduction to German Philosophy: from Kant to Habermas, Polity Press, 2003, 291pp, $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0745625711.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Geller, University of North Carolina, Pembroke


First impressions of Andrew Bowie's Introduction to German Philosophy will be of the breadth of material it covers. Subtitled From Kant to Habermas, it surveys an even wider historical sweep, beginning with Herder and Hamann, whose ideas anticipated Kant and suggested the pattern of responses that would emerge in the Romantic critiques of Idealism. The book also considers the effects of German philosophy outside of Germany, including the Czech philosopher Bernard Bolzano, and (though briefly) such recent figures in the Anglo-American tradition as Donald Davidson, Hilary Putnam, Michael Dummett, and Richard Rorty. Suffice it to say that Bowie covers an impressive array of material, much of it extraordinarily difficult, in this short book. As though that were not enough, he also hopes to reveal the interaction between philosophical trends and the political and social conditions under which they emerged. To accomplish all of this in 269 pages, he must be able to summarize complex arguments concisely and to identify and elaborate the crux of various theses with extreme efficiency and precision. For the most part, he succeeds. The book's main deficiency is that it does not have a clearly defined target audience. Self-advertised as an introduction, it frequently presupposes a degree of familiarity with the subject matter that neither undergraduates nor most graduate students can reasonably be assumed to possess.

Much of the book exhibits the qualities necessary for Bowie to accomplish his ambitious objectives. For example, he summarizes a critical difference between Kant and Hegel in the following admirably condensed passage:

For Kant, existence could not be considered a concept of the same kind as other concepts, because it was itself always required for the true use of a concept. Hegel's argument relies upon the claim that every concept depends for its determinacy upon its relation to other concepts which it is not, so that even the concept of being depends, for example, upon the concept of nothing (90).

A few pages later he makes a brief but helpful observation about German Idealists in general:

The aim of thinkers in German Idealism was to overcome the split between thought and the world that seemed to follow from Kant. They sought to do so on the basis of the conviction that thought is able to grasp the real once it has fully grasped its own structures (93).

Moving from Idealism to its Romantic critics, Bowie gives the following summary of their disagreement over irony:

In Hegel's case … irony ceases at the end of the system, because all the negatives lead eventually to the positive recognition that one has exhausted negativity: negativity is the path to the truth. Romantic irony, on the other hand, does not come to an end. The sense that we can never rest with a final certainty becomes the essential fact about our being (99).

An impressive summary of Feuerbach's disagreement with Hegel is contained in the following passage:

Feuerbach's main desire is for the species to realize its potential, much of which depends on the possibilities of sensuous enjoyment and inspiration. Hegel is, for Feuerbach, the last significant modern manifestation of the attempt to sustain the inversion of God and nature that is present in religion (116).

Admirably brief and precise formulations are available with respect to nearly every philosopher addressed. Illustrative quotations could be given with respect to Schopenhauer (107), the early Wittgenstein (174), Husserl (187), Dilthey (200-1), and Heidegger (207), to mention only a few.

Some of the book's deficiencies also spring from its brevity. Occasionally, the presentation is marred by a series of authors' names that will not be familiar to many readers, certainly not to readers using the book as an introduction. For example, having just cited Fichte, Spinoza, and Jacobi in the previous five lines, Bowie proceeds as follows:

In 1783 Jacobi had become involved in a dispute … with the Berlin Enlightenment philosopher, Moses Mendelssohn. The dispute was over the claim that G. E. Lessing (1729-81) had admitted to being a Spinozist (73).

While this is interesting to readers already familiar with these authors, those seeking an introduction to German philosophy will find it distracting and unhelpful. Neither Mendelssohn nor Lessing had appeared to that point, nor do they reappear afterward. Less than a page later, Bowie continues:

The problem Schelling encounters in Fichte was first identified by his friend, the poet and philosopher Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843), in the light of Jacobi's formulation of the problem of the 'unconditioned'. Hölderlin's idea recurs in aspects of early Romantic philosophy from the same period, notably in Novalis' own critique of Fichte (74).

Though Hölderlin is mentioned again twice in the book, and though Jacobi's formulation of the problem of the unconditioned becomes a central theme, the dense succession of proper names is not helpful. Again, readers hoping for an introduction will not find it here. Passages such as these indicate that the book is not pitched consistently to any particular audience. It is often pitched on a level that only specialists will appreciate.

In an effort to remedy this problem, Bowie provides a glossary, in which he explains potentially problematic terms. The terms he explains are all well chosen, some because they will be entirely new to many readers (for example, 'ontotheology,' 'Dasein,' and 'noema') and some because they are used in unusual ways by philosophers (for example, 'immediacy' and 'spontaneity'). The explanations he offers are, as is the entire book, extremely condensed. Usually the explanations he provides are helpful, as in the case of 'pragmatism,' which appears in the body of the text (100) as a dangling appendage with no clear meaning or use.

There is one term of particular interest, however, because it plays such a pivotal role in Bowie's narrative.

spontaneity that which is 'cause of itself', rather than being caused by something else; used by Kant to characterize our faculty of knowing things by active judgement.

Despite the fact that his usage is consistent with Kant's, that does not make the term any less misleading to relative newcomers to German philosophy. The transcendental structure of human understanding posited by Kant is a fixed system that is not subject to personal or historical variation, nor, as Bowie points out, to will (23). At times, most notably in the glossary itself, he uses 'active,' a more helpful cognate, to elucidate 'spontaneous.' In the text, he writes of the "active contribution by the mind" (19), having just introduced Kant's thesis that knowledge must have as one of its two sources categories and concepts, the "mental rules according to which we link intuitions together into judgements" (18). The term 'spontaneity' is likely to confuse readers who depend on the glossary because it makes no sense to speak of the a priori structure of understanding as caused, whether by itself or by anything else. But there are other reasons as well, as Bowie points out, that the term "might seem odd" (18). When 'spontaneity' reappears in other contexts, its meaning is further obscured, as in the following example:

Some thinkers, like Schopenhauer and Freud, claim that the problem of self-knowledge reveals an irrational basis for the rational aspects of the subject. This basis is the source of the subject's spontaneity, which is inaccessible to philosophical explanation and which must be explored by other means, such as art or psychoanalysis (24, emphasis added).

Though the term is still used to indicate the active contribution made by the subject to experience, it is, quite emphatically in the case of Schopenhauer, linked to non-rational will, which is more consistent with its ordinary sense. In his discussion of the Third Critique, Bowie continues his thematic treatment of the problematic notion:

One cannot produce art simply by making something in terms of the rules of a particular form: art involves moving beyond existing rules. The source of new rules has to be another kind of spontaneity, otherwise the rules would just reproduce what has already been done. This spontaneity seems to come from nature itself (37, emphasis added).

What is at stake reaches its full elaboration in the following passage:

In Kant's case, the problem lies in explaining how it is that the spontaneity of the subject emerges from a deterministic nature. If the subject is itself in some sense part of the natural world, it cannot be the case that the subject is wholly independent of the way the world is (39, emphasis added).

This issue will reemerge later, most notably in the sections on Hamann, Fichte, Schelling, and Nietzsche. For the purposes of this review, however, what needs to be pointed out is that Bowie's critical explication of Kant's notion(s) of spontaneity, though certainly worth pursuing, is embedded in an introductory text and is not likely to assist readers using it as such.

Similarly, the chapter on Nietzsche (133-155) is unlikely to serve readers who are not already well versed in his thought. It begins promisingly enough, the first page containing the following succinct statement:

The task is to work out what it is that makes thinking into projection rather than true apprehension, so that whatever it is that gives rise to the projection therefore becomes the real basis of philosophy (133).

The ensuing discussion of tragedy, interpretation, and the will to power (among other major themes) is less successful, however, than other parts of the book. At the end of the chapter the author lists four options for interpreting Nietzsche's response(s) to the quest for the absolute: (1) The principle that underlies the absolute, from Descartes to Nietzsche, is subjectivity. (2) The absolute is a regulative idea arising from attempts to transcend the finite. (3) The absolute is a delusion that needs to be exposed as such by means of an "ironic deconstructive strategy." (4) We must accept the (absolute) truth as "an ineliminable part of what it is to think and communicate at all." It is difficult, however, to see how the options follow systematically from the previous discussion.

This chapter is of particular importance because Nietzsche is presented as a watershed figure, in whose writings the past converges and the future begins to take shape. The move from the chapter on Nietzsche to the following chapter on "The Linguistic Turn" is itself a sharp turn. The book crescendos with Nietzsche and decrescendos dramatically in the subsequent chapter. Even granting the difficulties generated by Nietzsche's unorthodox ideas, Bowie does not make the task easier for readers seeking an introduction.

The chapter on "The Linguistic Turn" includes a section on Gottlob Frege, whose philosophical style contrasts sharply with that of his predecessors. Bowie's unease here is illustrated by his explication of Frege's distinction between functions and arguments (164), a distinction that, as Bowie says, derives from mathematics. The examples Bowie gives of functions ("2 + 2, 1 + 3, etc.") which are, he says, "satisfied by the argument 4" are not functions, nor is 4 an argument. Roughly speaking, the term 'argument' is used in mathematics to designate an input or independent variable which, when processed by a function, yields an output, the dependent variable. Frege's use of the term in its mathematical sense already poses a challenge to his readers and Bowie's explication does not make their task easier.

That the book is not consistently geared to readers seeking an introduction is revealed by Bowie's occasional use of the expression 'of course,' often in the context of propositions that are not in the least self-evident. On some occasions, p. 27 for example, the expression signals merely that the issue in question has already been addressed in the text. On others, for example, p. 171, the usage is similarly benign. By contrast, there are several instances in which its use is inappropriate and misleading, more an inadvertent appeal for further critical thinking than an accurate gauge of which questions are settled.

Consider the assertion that "The history of trade-unionism will, of course, prove [Marx] wrong" (125, emphasis added). On some occasions, Bowie uses the expression to signal that he has an argument that provides conclusive proof, as in his criticism of Nietzsche's reliance on the will to power as an absolute:

The consequence of this position is, of course, just nonsense, as though there were no essential difference between an eagle being its kind of power by eating the lamb, and Himmler being his kind of power by killing Jews despite the fact that he has encountered moral notions in his education (150, emphasis added).

This presumed refutation overlooks the fact that Nietzsche offers a critique of moral notions in education, a critique framed by the notion of the will to power. While readers will agree with the sentiment expressed, the question is whether this counterargument is adequate. The appearance of 'of course' and 'nonsense' give the impression that Nietzsche's position is more vulnerable and less plausible than it actually is. The last thing readers should do is underestimate the power of Nietzsche's thought.

The footnote on p. 39 is troubling because it presupposes detailed historical knowledge on the part of the reader:

Given the problems concerning the definition of 'realism', it is important to remember that its meaning at the end of the eighteenth century in Germany is often closer to materialism, in contrast with idealism. The former position is often associated with Spinoza, the latter with Berkeley. Kant's transcendental idealism is, of course, an attempt to get beyond such a division (emphasis added).

On at least three other occasions, Bowie makes similarly excessive demands:

The need for an absolute basis is a metaphysical need, and Nietzsche is, of course, attacking this need (151, emphasis added).

The whole point of philosophical foundations is, of course, to overcome contingency (187, emphasis added).

The underlying issue here is, of course, the old Platonic difference between appearance and essence (203, emphasis added).

Whereas at least some of these claims would be readily acceded to by readers well versed in philosophical literature, they will not have this effect on relative newcomers to the field, who will be frustrated in their search for something obvious or self-evident.

The main deficiency of the book, as I have suggested, is that it does not have a clearly defined target audience. When it is directed to relative newcomers, it exhibits the necessary clarity and brevity to serve as an introduction. When it is directed to scholars in the field, it contains valuable critical insights. As it stands, the book is a compound between the two. Everyone from novices to specialists will benefit from Bowie's passionate engagement and lively writing style.