Introduction to Non-Marxism

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François Laruelle, Introduction to Non-Marxism, Anthony Paul Smith (tr.), Univocal Publishing, 2015, 194pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781937561239.

Reviewed by Ian James, University of Cambridge


As the Anglophone reception and appreciation of François Laruelle's work grows, it is worth reminding ourselves of the radicality of its ambition to be a thoroughgoing non-representational style of theorising and thinking. Carried out in the name of the destruction of onto-theology, the overcoming of metaphysics, the excess of the Real, or the deconstruction of presence, the attempt to think outside of traditional representational categories and to do so by means of novel philosophical styles or gestures is, of course, typical of much twentieth-century European philosophy, particularly that coming out of France. It may be tempting, therefore, to view Laruelle's writing as simply one further, albeit idiosyncratic in the extreme, example of philosophical and stylistic invention that places its impossible object of thought in excess of thought itself. Yet, as Laruelle has consistently argued at least since the early 1980s, philosophy has never gone, nor can ever go, far enough in its suspension, destruction or deconstruction of representational thought. Notions of radically withdrawn, ungrounded Being, of transcendence or alterity that would be otherwise than Being, or of difference that would detach philosophy and ontology from all logic of foundation or totality and place the very notion of Being itself under erasure simply do not, for Laruelle, go far enough. For in the end such notions remain conceptual and representational if only because they represent being as withdrawn, as transcendence or alterity, or as difference in excess of ontological foundation or ground. For Laruelle, any kind of ontology, be it differential, negative, or given in the mode of an exacerbated apophasis, does not and cannot do justice to the radical immanence of the Real.

The radicality of this ambition to be a non-representational style of theory or thought is worth remembering since it allows us to appreciate the specificity of Laruelle's non-philosophy in general and the unique character of his Introduction to Non-Marxism in particular. In relation to the general overview it should be noted that previous reviews of the major works Philosophy and Non-Philosophy (NDPR, 2013.12.24) and Principles of Non-Philosophy (NDPR, 2014.4.13) have given ample accounts of Laruelle's axiomatic thinking of the Real as radical immanence and as indivisible and autonomous One, as well as of his characterization of philosophy itself as an operation or discourse of conceptual transcendence and authoritarian domination. These summary accounts will not be repeated here. Non-Marxism itself is characterized towards the end of Introduction as a kind of theoretical formalism and as an impossible theory insofar as it would describe or represent absolutely nothing of the invisible Real but would rather be 'the theoretical style that is adequate to the unthinkable and the unknowable, a form of theory made for what is radically invisible or imperceptible in forms of representation' (179). The notion of adequation here is decisive: such a theory would not strictly speaking be a simple representation of the Real as unrepresentable, nor would it be a negative knowledge of the Real by way of an apophatic saying. Rather it would be a theory that seeks to make itself adequate to the unrepresentable Real by divesting itself of all vestigial traces of representational logic. Non-Marxism, then, needs to be understood as the attempt by thought to transform Marxism in all its aspects 'by determining the ensemble of its apparatus through the radical immanence of the Real' (10). Echoing the famous eleventh thesis on Feuerbach it can be said that, while philosophers have all tried to represent the world, the point here is to eschew such representation entirely in order to radically change all relation to the world.

For those hoping that Laruelle's non-Marxism will offer illuminating readings of texts by Marx himself or somehow re-invigorate either Marxist theory or the effectivity of its practice and its power to transform the world, some considerable disappointment may lie in wait. Laruelle begins from the perspective of Marxism's failure, a failure which is at once its historical failure as a political project and its philosophical failure to embrace or pursue some of its most radical insights to their full extent. The historical failure of Marxism is taken as a given by Laruelle and not discussed in any detail from a strictly historical perspective. Most important in relation to Marxism's philosophical failure is its conception of materialism on the one hand and, on the other, its inability to embrace the full radicality of the relation between the infrastructure and superstructure according to the determination in the last instance of the latter by the former. For Laruelle, there remains in Marxism 'a constitutive remainder of philosophical sufficiency' (32) which must be suspended if the radicality of its insight is to be fully realized and if its desire to break with philosophy as interpretation and representation is to be fulfilled.

Of course both materialism and the determination in the last instance of the societal superstructure by its material-economic base play key roles in Althusser's thought and his understanding of Marx's Dialectical Materialism as a philosophy and Historical Materialism as a science. The origins of Laruellian non-philosophy in the Althusserian philosophical milieu of 1970s France must not be forgotten in this context. Laruelle's objection, in relation to the materialism of both Marx and Althusser, is that they do not go far enough in their affirmation of a material immanence which is determining in the last instance. This, still philosophical, materialism:

demands immanence but in fact this is the object of a transcendent position, still a hinterworld of authentic immanence . . . matter and thought, being and consciousness continue to reciprocally determine each other within an all-encompassing philosophy (9)

In other words the doctrine of materialism represents the real as an immanently material base, but this representation operates necessarily according to the mechanisms of conceptual transcendence proper to philosophy, that is to say, the division of the real into an immanence-transcendence dyad and its mixing in a synthesised, totalizing image of the real. In order to think materialism outside of its philosophical determination what is necessary, Laruelle argues, is a more radical understanding of determination in the last instance, one which will yield the unilateral 'Determination-in-the-Last-Instance (DLI)' that forms the key operation of non-philosophy.

Laruelle's re-elucidation of Marxist determination substitutes the notions of material-economic base and societal-ideological superstructure with the radical immanence of the Real on the one hand and the transcendence of the given World on the other. World, in this capitalized form, becomes identified with the world as it is both thought or represented and as it is lived in all possible worldly identities and relations. The category of World also thereby becomes identified with both philosophy and capitalism. DLI, then, is 'the causality of the real base as radical immanence' (52). The real base, or the base of the Real, is an immanent cause, but this causality, for Laruelle, needs to be distinguished from all the existing notions of causality that can be found in philosophy or metaphysics. He specifies that: 'DLI is an original causality without a regional (naturalist or social) model or a fundamental and metaphysical one' (49). Non-philosophical Determination-in-the-Last-Instance by the immanent Real is not a causality that obtains between phenomena, objects or things, nor is it one that is at work within natural, historical or social processes. Rather DLI is the operation by which all phenomena, things and processes, insofar as they are ultimately real, are universally determined or caused, but in-the-last-instance only, by the immanent Real. Laruelle expresses this in the following terms: 'DLI is a causality that is simultaneously real, universal, immanent, and heterogeneous or critical and, as such, DLI is not included in the four forms of the causality of Being (final, material, formal, efficient)' (44).

So DLI is never an ontic concept pertaining to particularities that are manifest or given within the world, nor is it ontological or metaphysical. It only has meaning, Laruelle says, for the Real understood as One and has no meaning at all 'for the matter deducted via the World's mode of givenness' (54).

Most decisively the determination or causality proper to the DLI is unilateral or entirely one-way. That is to say, while the immanent Real determines universally, it is never itself determined, it is never touched or affected by what it determines. It remains always entirely indeterminate, indivisible, autonomous and One. This logic of universal and unilateral determination or causality is perhaps the single most important operation of non-Marxism and of non-philosophy more generally. According to this logic all other forms of causality are necessarily secondary. From the perspective of the DLI all the modes of causality known to philosophy or metaphysics are themselves also and necessarily Determined-in-the-Last-Instance by or through the radical immanence of the Real. As Laruelle puts it:

every secondary causality, as multiple as it is, is only taken into account and introduced within the final "reckoning" on the condition of "passing" through the principle causality or through the infrastructure, toward which the secondary causality is by definition "indebted" (42)

There is a strong resemblance here with theological occasionalism, the difference being that the one true God and one true cause is substituted with the Real as One and the DLI as the sole principle causality. This difference, of course, is decisive, for where occasionalism is in the service of transcendence, the causality of the DLI makes sense only in and through the axiom of radical immanence.

One might wonder at this stage what becomes, or has become, of Marxism itself both in its specifics and in 'the ensemble of its apparatus'. Effectively Marxism becomes non-Marxism when it is transformed in all its aspects into an object posited by the axiomatic system of DLI and thereby placed into a relation of unilateral duality with the Real. The logic of unilateral duality suspends the constitutive remainder of philosophical sufficiency within Marxism. That is to say, it suspends the essentially representational logic of the transcendence-immanence dyad that structures the Principle of Philosophical Sufficiency (PSP) and that Laruelle sees to be at work in all philosophy. From the perspective of DLI all the aspects of Marxism are transformed into the state of materials which do not represent the Real but which are unilaterally determined by it.

Laruelle describes this transformation helpfully when he says that the 'syntax of uni-lateral duality [is] substituted everywhere for contradiction and struggle' (65). Non-Marxism therefore is not a dialectic of contradictions and relations that is at work within history or the World and is not at all concerned with differential worldly relations. Rather its syntax of irreducible and universal unilaterality ignores worldly relation and difference in order to introduce a 'radicality of practice' (65). According to this practice the various aspects or content of Marxism are 'cloned', that is to say 'unilateralized by the Real-of-the-Last-Instance and unable to be converted with it' in a 'being-cloned of the world by the "real base"' (77). Where there was once dialectical, differential and worldly relation described according to the operations philosophical division and synthesis, there is now only unilateral duality and non-philosophical 'dualysis'. All the key operators or categories of Marxist theory become subject to the logic of unilateral duality: Dialectical Materialism, Historical Materialism, capitalism, the proletariat, class struggle, revolution and so on. What matters for non-Marxism is not that these instances represent phenomena in the World. The relation of all these instances to each other in a worldly dynamic or dialectic of historical and social forces is not its concern. Rather what its syntax of universal unilaterality affirms is their identity-in-the-last-instance with the radically indeterminate and un-representable Real.

One might wonder, once again, where the ambition of Marxism to change the world finds its place within the operation of non-Marxist unilateral dualization. The syntax of unilateral duality places everything back into an identity with the indeterminate Real but does so at the expense of any and all logic of representation, mediation or relation by which concrete interventions in the world might be pursued and the effective transformation of capitalism achieved. For many with commitments on the political left such an outcome may be met with expressions of exasperation, if not of derision. Yet Laruelle is very clear, the purpose of non-Marxism is not to do away with struggle but to transform the terms upon which struggle occurs when it is determined by the immanent Real rather than by way of Marxism's philosophical transcendence and the legacy of failure it bears. The struggle of non-Marxism is a struggle that is carried out immanently against the World and against the World-form or, as Laruelle puts it, it is: 'an immanent struggle with the capital-world, and not a struggle by way of transcendence interspersed with the capital-world' (127).

There is something troubling about the militancy of Laruelle's capitalization of the world as World and his identification of the world-form in general with both capitalism and the authoritarian transcendence of philosophy. There appears to be no room for any conception of worldly existence or manifestation as itself irreducibly plural, as existing or opening, one might say trans-immanently, in excess of the philosophical horizons of sufficiency, totality and domination. To this extent Laruelle's thought appears to be very close to the Gnostic heresies whose terms he incorporates into the materials of non-Marxism. The unilateral relation of radical immanence to worldly transcendence echoes the duality posed by Gnostic heresies between the world of pure spirit and the (fallen) manifest world created by the evil Demiurge. It is in this context that the immanent struggle of non-Marxism is explicitly identified with heresy, with a heretical struggle against the (capital-)World as such insofar as it is perceived as an oppressive orthodoxy. 'It is necessary', Laruelle says, 'to transform the revolutionary subject into a heretical subject' (108). Thus the proletarian subject of Marxist struggle will become the 'non-proletarian' subject of non-Marxist struggle. What matters here is immanently lived real identity as it is given prior to any and all worldly givenness in all its multiplicity. Thus Laruelle can say: 'Non-Marxism is heresy enacted in everyone' (105) and affirm it as a heresy that transforms the World: 'not within the World but within the non-proletarian's existence insofar as it participates in the World' (105). The heretical subject, placed back into an identity with its unknowable lived immanence stands in a unidirectional facing toward the World in a struggle to defend lived immanence itself from the harassment and domination of the World-form.

So Introduction to Non-Marxism is not just a non-philosophical reckoning of accounts with the legacies of Marx and Althusser. It is the redefinition of non-philosophical practice as a particular attitude of struggle with and against the World and as a mode of modern heresy. In the end its force remains in the service of a dismantling of representation rather than of any re-invigoration of Marxism as such. This may remain disappointing to some and indeed the wholesale characterization of the World as transcendence and domination may remain troubling or problematic. Yet for those wishing and willing to follow through the implications of radical immanence to its furthest and most uncompromising expression in contemporary thought, Laruelle's non-Marxism cannot be surpassed in ambition, rigour and originality.