Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing

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Martin Heidegger, Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing, Phillip Jacques Braunstein (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2011, 74pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253355911.

Reviewed by Katherine Withy, Georgetown University


In the winter semester of 1944, Martin Heidegger began what would be his final lecture course at the University of Freiburg -- indeed, his last official lectures as a professor. Translated here, Einleitung in die Philosophie -- Denken und Dichten (Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing) asks after the inner relationship of philosophy and poetry, thinking and poetizing. Pursuing this question does not 'introduce' (einleiten) us to philosophy; by our essence, we are already 'in' philosophy. But we are not at home in our philosophizing essence, and so we need a guide (Anleitung) in this "unknown region" (p. 3). Our guides in this course are Nietzsche, the poetizing thinker of homelessness, and Hölderlin, the thoughtful poet of homecoming. An encounter with Nietzsche's poetizing thinking and with Hölderlin's thinking poetizing will guide us towards a dwelling in our essence. Heidegger had spent much of the previous decade in confrontation with both Nietzsche and Hölderlin; here, he finally promises to think them together. Unfortunately, this promise is not fulfilled.

Heidegger privileges Nietzsche and Hölderlin in this text for several reasons. First, in each (yet in different ways), "poetizing and thinking are interwoven with one another in a single and wondrous way" (p. 13). Second, according to Heidegger, such interweaving has been seen before only at the beginning of the Western philosophical tradition -- in Plato and Parmenides, Pindar and Sophocles (pp. 6, 14). That we see it again now in Nietzsche and Hölderlin shows that this tradition has been completed. Thus a world-historical and philosophical necessity governs the interweaving of philosophy and poetry in these two figures. This is perhaps why, third, we tend to mention Nietzsche and Hölderlin together (p. 6). But also -- fourth -- the two have a special relationship to the German people. The German people are "the people of poets and thinkers" (p. 12) in that (according to Heidegger) the German spirit is uniquely determined in its essence by thinkers and poets. Nietzsche and Hölderlin each -- and together -- have a special role to play in the historical destiny of the German people, and the winter of 1944 is surely an apt time to consider this. For these reasons, we may "substitute the undetermined title 'Thinking and Poetizing' with the names Nietzsche and Hölderlin" (p. 7), and through a confrontation with these two figures we can question the relation between thinking and poetizing, ponder the completion of Western metaphysics, experience our homelessness and prepare for our essential homecoming.

Heidegger begins with Nietzsche, suggesting that in the figure of Zarathustra Nietzsche poetizes his 'thought of thoughts', the eternal recurrence of the same (p. 9). But to poetize a thought is not to express it in poetic language: "We do not see Nietzsche as a poetizing thinker for the reason that 'poems' can be found scattered in his texts and notebooks, and because the work Thus Spoke Zarathustra makes the definite impression of a poetic style with its language and form" (p. 54). What, then, is poetizing? What form does it take in Nietzsche's Zarathustra? And why does the thought of the eternal recurrence demand it? "What is this poetizing, and what is it doing in thinking?" (p. 40).

The course concludes abruptly with this question, after only two sessions. The course was cancelled because Heidegger had been called up for the Volkssturm (People's Militia) and deployed to Breisach. The text in this volume is a translation of the lectures that were given -- some forty small pages -- along with a handful of fragmentary notes and alternate versions of passages. We find also a reproduction of two of Heidegger's lecture announcements, complete with charred edges from the bombing of Freiburg in November.

The translation is readable and admirably unobtrusive. Phillip Jacques Braunstein (independent scholar and entrepreneur) renders Heidegger's key terms in recognisable ways. He has a keen sense of when and how to include the original German in order to reveal translation choices and Heidegger's wordplay without sacrificing the flow of the text. The German is also provided for the five poems by Nietzsche that Heidegger (very briefly) discusses.

The warrant for publishing such a severely truncated text is presumably to make available the parts of volume 50 of Heidegger's Gesamtausgabe that have not thus far appeared in English. GA50 was first published (in German) in 1990, and in addition to "Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing" it contains the 1940 lecture "Nietzsche's Metaphysics". The two are paired because both discuss Nietzsche and, according to the editor of GA50 (Petra Jaeger), Heidegger thought that "due to its brevity, ["Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing"] would not have sufficed for a single volume" (Editor's Afterword, p. 74). "Nietzsche's Metaphysics" is not translated here, and so this volume is not a translation of GA50, because the text is apparently very similar to that published in the four-volume collection of Heidegger's Nietzsche lectures (Neske, 1961), later to become GA6 and translated into English in the four-volume Nietzsche (between 1979 and 1987, now available in a two-volume paperback (HarperCollins, 1991)). Subtracting what has already appeared in English from GA50, we are left with the two sessions of "Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing" and various supplements (including a few pages of notes on "Nietzsche's Metaphysics"). This detritus, correctly held to be insufficient on its own, would have been better suited to a collection of essays and supplements than a stand-alone volume.

In short, the text is a tease. It would have been a most remarkable lecture course, but we have only the very beginning of it. One accomplishes little in two sessions when one is planning to speak for the entire term, and Heidegger is -- as always -- so careful to prepare his students for his style of thinking that he barely has time to begin to pose his questions. The start that he makes is recognisable from his other lecture courses, especially those on Nietzsche. Heidegger touches on familiar topics in his engagement with Nietzsche and familiar topics in his thought more broadly. He criticises Nietzsche for neglecting the ontological difference, recapitulates the connection between the will to power and the eternal recurrence, briefly sketches his and Nietzsche's accounts of (German) cultural atrophy in the age of nihilism and technology, and calls us to perform the Hölderlinian 'passage through the foreign' in a return to the ancient Greeks. Along the way, Heidegger reads five of Nietzsche's poems. These readings are disappointingly brief and relatively shallow, especially compared to his interpretations of poetry elsewhere. Combining the hints that Heidegger gives us here with material from roughly contemporaneous texts, we can anticipate how the course might have developed through the interpretation of Nietzsche to the connection with Hölderlin and the questioning of thinking and poetizing. But I do not see that the text contributes much of substance to our understanding of these topics. Heidegger has time to limber up his students' minds before the workout, but cannot do more than announce what kind of workout it will be.

Because the real philosophical work of the course is not carried out, it is hard to imagine who might benefit from this text. Those new to Heidegger might have benefitted from a partial lecture course like this, using it as a brief and readable propadeutic to Heidegger or to Heidegger's Nietzsche. Yet the trajectory of the text is too abbreviated to serve in this way. Scholars interested in Heidegger's engagement with Nietzsche, or in his accounts of thinking, poetizing or our contemporary homelessness, may find formulations, phrases or fragments that are of some interest (although, of course, these are already available in the Gesamtausgabe edition). One example is this strikingly beautiful description of philosophy as proper yet alien to us, which employs Heidegger's recurring lighting metaphor:

Philosophy is around humans day and night like the sky and the earth, almost even closer than they are, like the brightness that rests between them, which humans almost always overlook since they are only busy with what appears to them within the brightness. Sometimes, whenever it darkens, humans become especially attentive to the brightness around them. But even then, humans do not pay closer attention to it, because they are accustomed to the fact that the brightness returns. (p. 11)

We also find a rare definition of 'home' (Heimat): "the circumference that is historically enclosed and nourishing, that fuels all courage and releases all capacities, that surrounds the place where humans belong in the essential meaning of a claimed listening" (p. 24). The topics of home, homelessness and becoming homely are central for Heidegger in this period (arguably across his entire career), but the concept of 'home' in his writings has the maddening tendency of slipping surreptitiously between associations with the familiar, the proper, the origin, the starting point and the destination. Having a sense of what Heidegger means by the 'home' is useful, but of course we do not see him doing much with it here and it is not clear that the definition can be carried over to other texts.

To my mind, the main contribution of the text lies in Heidegger's interpretation of Nietzsche's poems "The Free Spirit" (also known by its first line, "Die Krähen schrei'n") and "Answer". Heidegger reads Nietzsche as rejecting a nostalgic homesickness (mere "yearning for something past") and calling for a homesickness that is "a willing-forward into a new home" (p. 28). This new home is itself characterised by homelessness (p. 35); it is the age of nihilism, the completion of Western metaphysics. Willing-forward into this new 'home' is what is poetized in the figure of Zarathustra. Although we find some fragmentary clues in the supplements, Heidegger does not have a chance to explore this idea. Presumably, such willing-forward, and the poetizing of it, is the task of the thinker. For as Heidegger says elsewhere, "The thinker thinks toward what is un-homelike, what is not like home, and for him this is not a transitional phase; rather, this is his being at home".[1] Insofar as being at home, or dwelling, is itself accomplished poetically, the thinker's willing-forward to a new home will be creative, and specifically poetic. This presumably opens the way for the poet's thinking, which we already know to be "a commemorative questioning that puts the homelike itself into poetry" (ibid.). So it would have been in the elaboration of this curious concept of 'willing-forward' that Heidegger would have found the pivot on which the Nietzsche-Hölderlin connection turns, and so the inner relation of thinking and poetizing. This elaboration, however, is left to the reader.

The last piece of writing that we have from Heidegger's hand is a message to Bernhard Welte. Heidegger writes: "For there is need for contemplation whether and how, in the age of a uniform technological world civilization, there can still be such a thing as home".[2] This is the question that Heidegger begins to raise in this lecture course, and at stake in it is nothing less than our ability to be what we are -- our ability to inhabit our essence. But if this question moves us, if we too find this contemplation needful, then we must look to texts other than Introduction to Philosophy -- Thinking and Poetizing in order to understand and carry on the Heideggerian project.

[1] Martin Heidegger, "Remembrance", in Elucidations of Hölderlin's Poetry (New York: Humanity Books. 2000), p. 151.

[2] Heidegger, "Grusswort für Bernhard Welte" (1976), cited in Rüdiger Safranski, Martin Heidegger: Between Good and Evil, tr. Ewald Osers (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press. 1999), p. 432.