Introductions to Nietzsche

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Robert Pippin (ed.), Introductions to Nietzsche, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 292pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521189910.

Reviewed by Robert Guay, Binghamton University


As an artifact of publishing, Introductions to Nietzsche is a strange item. It consists of the introductions to all eleven Nietzsche volumes in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series, plus a new introduction by Robert Pippin. (Yes, that is an introduction to the introductions to Nietzsche, which, one might hope, could itself become canonical and inspire a Very Short Introduction, and so on.) What makes this strange is that since the audience for reading about a book tends to overlap with the audience for reading the same book, the most likely market for these introductions already has them. A few recalcitrants probably never bothered to get the generally excellent Cambridge translations, but they could just pick up a couple desired volumes. So how would this collection appeal to the non-specialist, who is not going to read every book in the series, but nevertheless wishes to read about them all? Not by contributing to a common plan: there are overlapping discussions and conflicting agendas, and nearly everyone seems to wish they were writing about a different book. Even as little more than the sum of its parts, this volume is nevertheless valuable. Approximately all of the essays are well worth reading, and collectively they do a good job of representing the current state of Nietzsche discussion.

In this volume there seem to be three rough strategies for introducing Nietzsche. We can call these the Summary, the Teaching Moment, and the Major Statement. These strategies blend into each other somewhat, but the Summary is the most popular.  That strategy is to provide some historical context, air some hermeneutic grievances, and then proceed to summarize and assess the main arguments. There is some inefficiency here -- for example, it seems like a waste to have Alexander Nehamas summarizing Schopenhauer, let alone amid several other Schopenhauer summaries. But the strategy is generally successful.

Raymond Geuss's introduction to The Birth of Tragedy, for example, analyzes the text's arguments as responding to a set of questions about the nature and worth of human culture and as making what Geuss calls "a contribution to philosophical theodicy" (p. 59). What makes this approach a success is that it manages to handle the text that Nietzsche himself called "impossible" without either neglecting the importance of the arguments or depicting them as more coherent than they are. The problem with The Birth of Tragedy, apart from its arbitrary metaphysical claims, is that it advances a humanist project, about the value of art and culture, in the language of Schopenhauer's metaphysics. As a result it moves back and forth between the primacy and unreality of culture, and the standpoint of individual redemption and non-individuation; it understands phenomena as both unreal and important; and it posits two forces as fundamental, or sometimes three or one or none. All this gives the interpreter one big choice: either try to make sense of the metaphysics and show how it could possibly map onto this-worldly phenomena, or historicize and psychologize the metaphysics so that one sees the whole enterprise as a project of diagnosing and remedying cultural dissatisfaction. Geuss chooses the latter. The destruction of the principium individuationis is treated, then, as a potential source of pleasure, and aesthetic justification fits into "one of the last and most distinguished contributions to a central European debate about the ills of modern society" (49). Someone might prefer a discussion of the thing-in-itself and primal unity, but Geuss's approach is the only hope for making sense of the whole work in the context of Nietzsche's thought, and his treatment is masterful.

Four other chapters take up the Summary approach. Alexander Nehamas has the unenviable task of introducing the "Early Notebooks," which extend to what is usually considered Nietzsche's middle period. This task is unenviable because it turns out to be a challenge to explain why we should bother to read Nietzsche's early notebook entries. Nietzsche , after all, abandoned, rejected, or replaced these writings. The case that Nehamas makes is compelling but somewhat narrow: that we can better understand Nietzsche's intentions in his published works if we read these writings. In particular, we can come to understand that Nietzsche was never in his publishing career committed to Schopenhauer's views, and that he was "ambivalent" (34) about his own early epistemological positions.

Daniel Breazeale's treatment of the Untimely Meditations also takes up the Summary strategy. I only have one reservation with Breazeale's excellent treatment. With respect to Nietzsche's later development, Breazeale recounts a number of "essential 'Nietzschean' subjects" (67) and "characteristically Nietzschean themes" (88) such as cultural renewal, the cultivation of the true self, and creativity. These themes are no doubt present in the Untimely Meditations, but I wonder how much of these themes remain in the later work. One might instead get the impression that Nietzsche is much more sanguine about the possibilities of creative, spontaneous individuality here, where he is mostly discussing cultural renewal, than in the later works, where he is often taken to be more individualistic.

Aaron Ridley organizes his discussion around the topics of "Becoming Who You Are" (218) and Nietzsche's treatments of integrity, Christianity, decadence, Wagner, and Nietzsche himself. Here I shall express my only reservation with the discussion, with which I am in nearly complete agreement. Becoming "who one is," on Ridley's account, requires acknowledging that "one is essentially just an animal" (219), but an animal with a second nature. One can cultivate this second nature by organizing and reinterpreting the elements of one's life as conditions of freedom rather than merely as limitations. This requires that we are "honest with ourselves" (219) about our merely natural capacities, discarding any pretensions and untruths, and developing a more clear-sighted, self-transparent perspective. My reservation here is that it casts the process of self-development as more epistemic than it is or than Nietzsche takes it to be. Nietzsche certainly values intellectual conscience, but not as the basis of self-development. If anything, Nietzsche suggests the opposite, that errors and unredeemable hopes are fundamental. A commitment to debunking naturalism might nevertheless be necessary for the contemporary possibility of freedom, given who we already are, but then we would need an explanation of why freedom, for us, is so deeply connected to that kind of self-understanding. More generally, my worry is that Ridley gets the process backwards: rather than discarding mistaken beliefs to arrive at oneself, Nietzsche suggests that some kind of transformation has to take place, from which self-recognition follows. The cognitive is tied up with the conative and with all the social, corporeal, and historical conditions that are never fully transparent, but involved in developing a second nature.

Rüdiger Bittner also takes up something of a Summary approach to the Late Notebook writings. The main discussion is organized around an analysis of Nietzsche's "task" (246) as working out a "comprehensive and credible naturalism" (246). Bittner's view of Nietzsche's naturalism is unconventional. It consists in understanding things in terms of life, which is accounted for in terms of will to power rather than mechanical processes. By this form of naturalism, then, "Nietzsche continues the tradition of transcendental philosophy" (256). The demands of life furnish the "form of knowability" (256) by which we make sense of the world. There is one place, however, where Bittner is wrong. Bittner quotes Beyond Good and Evil §230, where Nietzsche identifies his task as "translating man back into nature," and interprets this as an "untranslating" (246) by means of which we discard "as a mere product of human vanity any richer conception of ourselves" (247). But Nietzsche continues in that passage, saying that we must "gain control of the many vain and fanciful interpretations," which implies that these interpretations persist. This may be a strange outcome, but it is a part of Nietzsche's view that nature and life are in an uneasy relationship with each other and with themselves. "Anti-nature" is itself part of the economy of life, and life can turn against (or "cut into") itself. For self-interpreting creatures such as us, there is furthermore no neutral, vanity-free language in which to give an account of ourselves, and thus no such thing as untranslating. Even if there were, it would be just another hermeneutic activity that we engage in.

The second strategy of introduction can be called the Teaching Moment. This responds to the chaos of Nietzsche's texts and their strange diversity of styles, topics, and aims with the goal of conveying one big lesson that is occasioned by Nietzsche's discussion. Richard Schacht's introduction to Human, All-too-human is exemplary here. Schacht responds to the welter of material in that work by taking the opportunity to characterize Nietzsche's thought there in terms of a "tough-minded and yet doggedly affirmative naturalism" (101). This form of naturalism stems from a dissatisfaction with both Enlightenment and Romantic views, but in "replacing art with science as the paradigm of high spirituality" (104), it seeks to offer an ameliorative view of human culture though its explanatory interest in human nature. The result is a wide-ranging philosophical anthropology, in which contributions from various disciplines -- "everything we can learn about human life from history, from the social sciences, from the study of arts, religions, languages, literatures, mores, and other features of various cultures" (102) -- combine to form an understanding of what it means to be human. I have little doubt that this is a compelling and attractive position, but I worry that Schacht might have chosen the wrong book. Human, All-too-human takes an interest in the full range of human phenomena, but as Nietzsche's "positivist" work, with a view to explaining them all in terms of some more basic domain -- usually, rather oddly, egoistic psychology or chemistry. It is one thing to take an interest in culture as a fundamental element of human experience, and another to take an interest in culture as evidence for or examples of some underlying explanans. Human, All-too-human is more frequently the latter.

Although summaries of the main narratives do take up most of Keith Ansell Pearson's introduction to On the Genealogy of Morality, we might nevertheless see it as a Teaching Moment introduction. The presentation of the narrative is framed by a discussion of how to read Nietzsche's critique of morality, and this broader account is the focus of Ansell Pearson's contentions. This is indeed consistent with his treatment of Nietzsche, according to which the errors of morality are so pervasive that they have been incorporated into how we think and feel about nearly everything. There is an important point about the Genealogy here: because morality is implicated in our general theoretical outlook, its account of the origin of morality turns around into reflections on its own conditions for account-giving. My only reservation with Ansell Pearson's discussion is that it seems ambivalent as to what to make of this lesson. On one hand, we learn that the Genealogy is a deeply "subversive" (200) book that "seeks to develop a genuinely critical approach to morality, in which all kinds of novel and daring questions are posed" (202). On the other hand, we see a much more routine critical enterprise, in which the "sharp, unbiased eye of the critic" (203) looks to "question the so-called self-evident 'facts' about morality" (200). Nietzsche could be engaged in both enterprises, of course, but I wonder whether Nietzsche's main interest is not more like transforming our outlook than like considering others' 'facts' with an unbiased eye.

The Major Statement strategy is similar to the Teaching Moment strategy, but on a grander scale. It provides the occasion to say something fundamental about how one should read the work, or perhaps Nietzsche, or perhaps philosophy in general; such an introduction is often cited in others' works and portends a major publication in elaboration of the major statement. Maudemarie Clark and Brian Leiter's introduction to Daybreak can serve as an example of this strategy. The introduction aims to contextualize Daybreak as Nietzsche's development, under the influence of Schopenhauer and materialism, out of his earlier position and into his mature critique of morality. The analysis is lucid and detailed, but the main idea is that Nietzsche wishes to replace "'moral' or 'religious' explanations for phenomena with naturalistic explanations" (117). This, then, gives Nietzsche the means to develop his critique by demonstrating that morality is based on "false presuppositions" (118), primarily about the nature of agency.

I cannot go into details, but it is worth discussing how the relationship between the philosophical analysis of morality and its normative implications is conceived. There are at least three broad ways we can conceive of this relationship. One we could call "rationalist" for lack of a better term: the critique of morality could identify or furnish reasons for normative change. Second, a causal relationship: there could be an explanatory enterprise with no intrinsic connection to the normative one, but belief in which has some effect. Third, a logical relationship: the critique of morality might show that a logical presupposition is false, thereby requiring a revision of moral belief on pain of incoherence. Clark and Leiter characterize Daybreak as a version of three and a modified version of two.

My present suggestion is that, for three reasons, these are unlikely to be the main focus of Nietzsche's enterprise, especially in combination. First, the causal story and the logical story do not fit well together because it remains mysterious why getting anything right would matter. In the Clark and Leiter account, certain facts are supposed to be practically effective on account of their correctness. Sometimes such things would be called reasons, but here they are logical presuppositions that happen to coordinate with causes, I guess to be more naturalistic. But then -- this is the second reason -- there is no critique. One way of seeing this is to note that Nietzsche thinks that we should retain much of the causal legacy of superstition and error -- just not moral belief -- and that there are ways other than rejecting morality to make our beliefs consistent. My third reason is that, according to Nietzsche, morality has become secularized and utterly pervasive in a way that is independent of its origins or the theoretical beliefs trellised up around it.

Bernard Williams's introduction to The Gay Science seems to follow the form of the Major Statement, and it was succeeded by major publications, but I find it difficult to discern precisely what the statement is. Williams's main interest seems to be in the status of truthfulness as a non-instrumental value, and how this relates to the project of explaining the origin of our beliefs and the practical matter of how to go about revising our sentiments. In conveying this interest, Williams makes a number of interesting points; for example, about the role of "power" in Nietzsche's explanations (139), and the fact  "that the ideal of truthfulness did not go into retirement when its metaphysical origins were discovered." (148)

Robert Pippin's introduction to Thus Spoke Zarathustra is split between a faceted summary and an intersecting but more general point. The summary only shows certain sides of Zarathustra. It recounts a kind of self-consuming quest story: the nature and goal of Zarathustra's quest are shifting and ill-defined, his project seems to intrinsically both involve and exclude others, he seems confused about his own motivations, the quest is abandoned and resumed at various points, and it is not clear what, if anything, is accomplished. So one major statement here is that one must appreciate the parody and hence the irony of Zarathustra. And this leads to the more general point, that for Nietzsche the "great dilemma of modernity itself" (162) is manifest in a failure of desire:

the problem then, that Zarathustra must address, the problem of 'nihilism,' is a kind of collective failure of desire, bows that have lost their tension, the absence of 'need' or of any fruitful self-contempt, the presence of wretched contentment, 'settling' for far too little (163).

What Zarathustra dramatizes, then, is the difficulty of doing philosophy under contemporary historical conditions. We lack any authority to guide ourselves and philosophical remedies are themselves implicated in this failure. Responding to this lack requires, then, finding some way to inspire and become inspired, to be moved to desire, so that goals and commitments can re-emerge. I do not doubt that Nietzsche sees Zarathustra's and modernity's trouble in orectic, even erotic terms. What I find strange here is the suggestion that this is somehow a separate issue from the content of potential commitments, as if what is needed is some kind of philosophical or mythopoetic aphrodisiac. To be sure, Zarathustra's problem "cannot be corrected by taking up a better argument against such a failure" (165) in that whatever commitments might be found also need to be embodied, felt, lived, acknowledged, and so on. But I do not think that desire is separable from what is desirable and desired, or that figuring out how to sustain commitments is separable from figuring out what is worthwhile. And for us post-Kantian moderns, for whom the beehive of knowledge is where our treasure is, this figuring-out is going to involve offering reasons and making arguments.

This brings us back to Pippin's introduction to the introductions. Pippin uses a discussion of "amor fati" to identify a modern problem of "practical self-knowledge" (15) that arises for reflective agents subject to necessity. The various introductions are not remarked on, but I take the implicit suggestion to be that we can regard them all as taking sides in or attempting to reconcile an apparent tension in Nietzsche's work between a superlative view of human beings who can spontaneously step outside of nature and culture, and a deflationary or reductionist view of human beings who are merely points of subjection to external forces. Whether this has been solved, or we are stuck with the oscillation, or there might be some better picture, I leave for a future introduction.