Intuition, Imagination, and Philosophical Methodology

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Tamar Szabó Gendler, Intuition, Imagination, and Philosophical Methodology, Oxford University Press, 2010, 362pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199589760.

Reviewed by Tyler Doggett, University of Vermont


On the back of the paperback edition of Studies in the Ways of Words, Putnam distinguishes philosophers who are important because of important theories or writings from philosophers who are important because, besides producing theories or writings, their minds "scintillate." Tamar Szabó Gendler is in the second group; Intuition, Imagination, and Philosophical Methodology is a scintillating book.

The bulk of it comprises fourteen essays, all previously published. An introduction connects them, expounding on some central, recurrent ideas and also tracing some of the relations between the essays: which essays amplify which, which repeat which, which change the emphasis of which, etc. To each essay, footnotes have been added, relating the essays and updating the references.

The first six essays are on thought experiments and the use of the imagination therein. Mainly, these essays take up the tasks of explaining how thought experiments produce novel beliefs and explaining whether and how thought experiments justify beliefs. In the process, Gendler clarifies and weighs in on a debate between James Robert Brown and John Norton on whether thought experiments reduce to arguments and gives careful attention to some famous thought experiments by Galileo, Alvin Goldman, and Derek Parfit.

The next six essays are on imagination in general: its nature, its role in motivating action and producing emotion, and its relations to other mental states. Familiar topics like the paradox of fictional emotions and the nature of self-deception are discussed. Issues from early modern times -- the puzzle of imaginative resistance, the problem of the precipice -- are reintroduced.

The topic of the last two essays is a mental state -- Gendler calls it "alief" -- subtly -- and unsubtly -- different from imagination. More on those essays below.

The book is almost comically well-informed. The bibliography starts with these entries: a social psychological paper on priming effects; The Handbook of Platonism; Linda Martín Alcoff's book on gender and race; Joshua Alexander and Jonathan Weinberg's paper on epistemology and experimental philosophy; Possible Worlds in the Humanities, Arts, and Sciences; two papers on depressed people's comparatively clear-eyed evaluations; Gordon Allport's pioneering work on prejudice; William Alston and Jonathan Bennett's paper on Locke on personal identity. It goes on as it begins. And does so for 37 pages. In her introduction, Gendler notes that the essays "draw deliberately on empirical findings from contemporary psychology and on classic texts in the philosophical tradition" (13). They make use of plenty of non-classics too, and don't limit the science to contemporary psychology. The footnotes alone are worth the price of the volume.

The tying of psychology and early modern and ancient philosophy to Gendler's concerns appears in various essays. These themes frequently appear as well:

Theme 1: Various popular folk psychological explanations of certain commonplace psychological phenomena are no good.

"Self-Deception as Pretense," for example, argues that a simple belief-desire psychology is inadequate to account for self-deception -- imagination is needed. However, adding imagination (and perception and intention and …) isn't enough to account for behaviors induced by certain ingenious psychological experiments -- experiments detailed in "On the Relation between Pretense and Belief" and the two alief papers. Neither is adding imagination sufficient to explain more humdrum behaviors. This leads to:

Theme 2: Folk psychology fails to explain such behaviors because its catalog of mental states is too short.

"Imaginative Contagion" and "On the Relation …" set the stage for an investigation of states other than belief and imagination that nevertheless quite closely resemble belief and imagination in their ability to motivate action and produce emotion and beliefs. "Imaginative Resistance" is, among many other things, a trenchant look at states that might be confused with imagination.[1] The alief papers sustain an argument that if folk psychology has a future, it has to incorporate alief.

Theme 3: Non-doxastic states do a lot of the work belief does. Hence, it is a mistake to characterize belief simply in terms of its ability to do that work.

The importance of non-doxastic states in explaining our behavior is stressed in "On the Relation … ," "Self-Deception … ," "Imaginative Contagion," and the two alief essays. Their importance in explaining feelings is stressed in "On the Relation … ," "Self-Deception … ," "Genuine Rational, Fictional Emotions," and the alief essays. Their importance in justifying beliefs is stressed in all six essays in part one and the two alief essays.

Theme 4: How imagination motivates and produces emotions and how it works to persuade and justify depends on whether its object is presented "abstractly" or "concretely." The idea comes up in all six of the thought experiment essays and then again in the alief papers. Some of the most intriguing bits of the book depend on it. However, as my use of quotation marks might suggest, I am not confident I understand it, and perhaps the abstract/concrete distinction needs more elucidation than it gets.

Each theme bubbles up in the final essays on alief. And those essays are microcosms of the book: they are sparkling, erudite, compellingly unorthodox papers, stuffed with interesting and provocative examples and theses and ideas for future work. They draw connections between ancient philosophy, early modern philosophy, and contemporary philosophy. They draw extensively on literature in psychology.

In them, Gendler argues that there are certain things we do, certain ways we feel, and certain habits we have. She then argues that explanations of these things, ways, and habits using just the standard folk-psychological notions -- belief, desire, and imagination (and perception, intention, etc.) -- are defective. To fix the defect, she posits a novel mental state, alief.

Consider some of Gendler's examples. In a study by Paul Rozin (Rozin et al, 1990), subjects watched sugar being poured into two bottles, then affixed a label reading "not sodium cyanide, not poison" to one and a label reading "sucrose, table sugar" to the other. Subjects were reluctant to eat from the former but not the latter (269). Why?

Or consider a case akin to the case motivating the early modern "problem of the precipice": Some people are terrified by walking across glass walkways, suspended high off the ground, even when they know full well the walkways are safe. Why?

Or consider that some people who believe in racial equality nonetheless exhibit subtle forms of bias in their interactions with members of other races. Why?

Gendler posits alief to make sense of these things where

A paradigmatic alief is a mental state with associatively linked content that is representational, affective, and behavioral, and that is activated -- consciously or non-consciously -- by features of the subject's internal or ambient environment. (263; Gendler's emphasis)

To boot, when you alieve, the object of representation needs to be suitably "concrete." So, for example, in the sugar case, Gendler explains, the subject is presented with a bottle the contents of which are quite vividly represented as somehow being connected to poison. (The representing bit of alief ignores the "not" in the "not poison" label.) As a result, the representational content of the alief is something like that what's in the bottle is somehow connected to poison. The alief comes, too, with the content dangerous! -- that's the affective content. And the behavioral content is something like avoid! As Gendler notes, the idea that a mental state has such "content" perhaps strains the bounds of the notion of content, but the basic idea is clear enough: Rozin's subject is in a state representing that something is connected with poison; she feels the thing is dangerous; she is motivated to avoid it. And, furthermore, the three contents of her alief are linked. For example, when she alieves something is connected to poison, normally she alieves it is dangerous and to be avoided. Normally, there is no alieving something is poisonous and alluring and to be consumed.

In the walkway case, Gendler's idea is that the subject has an alief with this content: the walkway is very high up -- that's the representational content -- and terrifying -- that's the affective content -- and to be avoided -- that's the behavioral content.

And in the racism case, the subject alieves the member of the other race is other -- that's the representational content -- and discomfiting -- that's the affective content -- and to be treated differently than members of the subject's own race -- that's the behavioral content.

It all sounds a bit odd. Why go for it? Gendler floats this argument:

(P1) There are certain phenomena: People balking at eating what they know is sugar in Rozin's experiment, trembling on a walkway known to be safe, aversive racism, etc.

(P2) Putative psychological explanations of these phenomena that advert only to folk psychological states -- beliefs, desires, etc -- fail to explain these phenomena.

(P3) Adding alief to folk psychology explains the phenomena. Hence,

(C1) If there are folk psychological states, there is alief.

Note, as Gendler does on pp. 265, 285, 291, that the conclusion of this argument is not that there is alief. To get that, you need to add the premise that there are psychological states. And Gendler's attitude towards that premise, discussed briefly below, is ambivalence.

One might wonder about (P2) above. And one might wonder, too, about the fact that not much work goes into arguing for it. Over three pages, Gendler dispenses with explanations in terms of beliefs, imaginings, and perceivings.[2] Two arguments against such explanations come from general considerations about the nature of belief, imagining, and perceiving (270). Another comes from an analysis of subjects' behavior in Rozin's sugar experiment (268-270). Little attempt is made to discredit folk psychological explanations of the walkway or racism case. However, many other papers in the volume do discredit folk psychological explanations of this or that.[3] By essays 13 and 14 of this volume, folk psychology might be so thoroughly discredited that it'd be an awfully credulous reader who trusted its take on the walkway or racism cases. That said, little enough effort goes into showing that familiar folk psychological explanations fail that you get the impression that Gendler isn't really after their failure and that if (P2) is shown to be false or unsupported, it won't trouble Gendler much.

Even conceding that folk psychological explanations can't explain the phenomena, one might wonder whether mental states other than alief can explain the data. So one might wonder whether the argument is invalid since it might be that adding alief to folk psychology explains what needs explaining, but so do other additions. Gendler does not consider any rival explanations except for those in terms of simple folk psychology.

Because of this, one might wonder why her view isn't simply that folk psychology can't handle various cases. Why does she then add that it is alief and alief alone that can? Why not rest with the negative thesis? One possibility: alief just is whatever explains the cases. (This gets some support on p. 285.)

Another possibility: adding alief -- and only alief? -- makes for a unified explanation of the cases in question and other, related cases. This leaves open that a simple folk psychology can explain the cases without recourse to alief. What it insists on is that such folk psychological explanations will leave out the underlying unity of the phenomenon.[4] All this suggests a different argument than the one above, namely:

(P1) There are certain phenomena: People balking at eating what they know is sugar, etc.

(P4) There is a unified explanation of these phenomena.

(P5) That explanation implies there are aliefs. Hence,

(C2) There are aliefs.

Unlike the first, this is an argument for alief. Something like this argument, rather than (P1)-(C1) above, might underlie these passages:

The time has come to say what I think is unhelpful about the natural response that we're done [if] we say that [folk psychology explains Gendler's puzzle cases] … and why I want to say that in each of the cases, the response is (also or instead) helpfully understood as being due to alief … In short, to say that a relevant behavioral response is due to [various folk psychological states] does not preclude its being due to … alief … My claim is simply that it is also useful to have recourse to the notion of alief. (291; Gendler's emphases)

Introducing the notion of alief into our descriptive repertoire provides a useful alternative way of answering 'why?' questions when confronted with a behavior or tendency we seek to explain… . Without the availability of such a notion in our present framework, we are likely to misattribute mental states … , overlook important similarities … , neglect certain continuities … , and lack explanations for certain evaluations (285; my emphases).

By endorsing (P1)-(C2), Gendler would not commit to the claim that a folk-psychological theory can't explain the phenomena she is interested in. What she would commit to is just that if there are such explanations, they fail to capture what the phenomena have in common.

Take a simple folk psychological explanation of the walkway case: the subject perceives he is at a great height and this automatically produces terror and aversion. And take a simple folk psychological explanation of the racism case: the subject believes members of another race not to be, say, noisy and also believes, irrationally, that such members are noisy. If these explanations are right, what goes on in the walkway case is quite unlike what goes on in the racism case. Explaining what is going on in terms of alief, by contrast, unifies the phenomenon. But now everything depends on there being a unified phenomenon to be explained. Why go for that? It's unargued for; it's a topic for further exploration.

For another such topic, consider the following natural worry about alief. If there is such a thing, it is an agglomeration of other, more fundamental things: a representational state, a feeling, a motivation. Alief does no work that the more fundamental states cannot do. Gendler considers this objection and doesn't exactly deny what it asserts. She just points out that if there are beliefs, the same objection might hold: "One might argue that it is out of these more primitive association patterns ('Mama, warmth and comfort, purse lips to drink') that the less fundamental differentiated attitudes like belief, desire, and imagination are constructed" (264, fn. 16).[5] If so, then as aliefs are not fundamental but, rather, agglomerations of other states, neither are beliefs fundamental. They, too, are agglomerations of other states. And those other states do all the work belief is alleged to do. But what are these other states? How do they fit together? The alief papers -- really, many papers in the volume -- make a start on this work.

The trajectory of Gendler's work in general and this wonderful volume in particular is something like this: first, she investigates one role the imagination plays. She argues that in thought experiments imagination can do much work that belief does with regard to persuading and justifying. She then argues that imagination can do much of the work that belief does with regard to motivation and emotion and, in fact, that imagination is needed to do a lot of that work. She then investigates imagination more broadly, paying special attention to its relations to belief. Dissatisfied with the theories she finds, she then argues that neither imagination nor any other folk psychological state can do all the work that needs doing. Finding states that can do the work, she starts chipping away at the usefulness of imagination and belief. This book offers a tantalizing picture of a totally new philosophical psychology.[6]


Gendler, Tamar Szabó. Forthcoming. "On the Epistemic Costs of Implicit Bias," Philosophical Studies.

Gendler, Tamar Szabó. 2011. "Imagination", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Gendler, Tamar Szabó and Hawthorne, John. 2002a. "Introduction" in Gendler and Hawthorne (2002b).

Gendler, Tamar Szabó and Hawthorne, John, eds. 2002b. Conceivability and Possibility. New York: Oxford University Press.

Gendler, Tamar Szabó and Hawthorne, John. 2006a. "Introduction" in Gendler and Hawthorne (2006b).

Gendler, Tamar Szabó and Hawthorne, John, eds. 2006b. Perceptual Experience. New York: Oxford University Press.

Liao, Shen-yi and Gendler, Tamar Szabó. 2010. "Pretense and Imagination," Wiley Interdisciplinary Reviews: Cognitive Science, 2: 79-94. doi: 10.1002/wcs.91.

Rozin, Paul, Markwith, Maureen, and Ross, Bonnie. 1990. "The Sympathetic, Magical Law of Similarity, Nominal Response and Neglect of Negatives in Response to Negative Levels," Psychological Science 1/6: 383-384.

Smith, Michael. 1994. The Moral Problem. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.

[1] The investigation continues in Gendler (2011), Gendler and Hawthorne (2002a), and Liao and Gendler (2010).

[2] Perception is largely absent from the volume, though for some of Gendler's thoughts on it, see Gendler and Hawthorne (2006a). Desire is even less apparent. Harry Potter author J.K. Rowling gets more entries in the index than desire does.

[3] And note that Gendler develops the case for an alief-based explanation of the racism case in Gendler (forthcoming). That paper helpfully develops the notion of alief, too.

[4] Another recurrent idea in the volume, though less important than the four I singled out earlier: it is important for a psychological theory to show off continuity in the minds of kids, adults, and some lower animals. Something wrong with various rival psychological explanations of the phenomena Gendler is interested in is that they are incredibly implausible when applied to kids, full-grown sociopaths, frogs, etc. Yet some of the phenomena that lead Gendler to posit alief appear in kids and frogs.

Kids are featured in: "Imaginative Resistance," "On the Relation … ," and the alief papers. Lower animals are featured in: "On the Relation … ," "Genuine Rational … ," "Self-Deception … ," and the alief papers. The mentally unwell are featured in: "Thought Experiments Rethought," "On the Relation … ," "Imaginative Resistance," and "Genuine Rational … ".

[5] The issue of whether aliefs agglomerate other states is connected to a familiar though now not-much-discussed issue in moral psychology, namely, whether there are besires and, if so, whether such states are simply agglomerations of belief and desire. For discussion, see Smith (1994).

Gendler obliquely addresses this connection between alief and besire (281) and notes it is a topic for future work.

[6] I am grateful to Mark Moyer for helpful comments on this review.