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David Kaspar, Intuitionism, Bloomsbury, 2012, 214pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441179548.

Reviewed by David McNaughton, Florida State University


Despite the work of Robert Audi, Michael Huemer, and others, Intuitionism remains a widely misunderstood ethical theory, and so it is good to come across a book that avoids the standard mischaracterizations and defends it with vigor. David Kaspar's account of Intuitionism is fairly orthodox. We know certain fundamental moral principles, i.e., that certain kinds of act are (pro tanto) morally required, or morally wrong. Such principles are self-evident on careful reflection. Kaspar draws on Audi's careful work on self-evidence to defend Intuitionism against the charge that it invokes a weird faculty of moral awareness, unknown to science.

Intuitionism is pluralist with regard to fundamental principles: moral justification does not require a supreme principle of morality, whether utilitarian, Kantian, or contractualist. To show that no supreme principle is convincing, Kaspar appeals to what he terms the method of epistemic appraisal -- the method he takes Ross to have employed. As Kaspar conceives it, this method involves the direct comparison of two particular moral theories (or principles) as they apply to a particular case. Should the theories say different things about the same case then we test them by asking what, after careful scrutiny, we are inclined to believe. Such reflection can provide strong prima facie justification for one theory over another. The thought is that "each intuitive principle is more convincing than any proposition proposed for proving, justifying, or explaining it" (p. 59).

Since the method of epistemic appraisal is crucial to Kaspar's case for Intuitionism, it might, perhaps, have been spelled out with more care. What, exactly, is being compared with what? Is one principle being contrasted with another principle, or with a theory, or is it two theories that are being put up against one another? Kaspar deliberately elides these questions, since he holds that "When we evaluate moral reasons, we are implicitly evaluating moral theories" (p. 60). But is this true?

A familiar problem for many moral theories is that they sometimes deliver what seem to be counter-intuitive moral verdicts about particular cases (or kinds of case). Most moral philosophers agree that this is some sort of a strike against a theory. But this procedure is standardly seen, not as a method for comparing two theories, but for contrasting what one theory says with the views of what Ross calls the 'plain man' or, perhaps less tendentiously, with the deliverances of the ordinary pre-theoretical moral consciousness. The ordinary person is not, at least explicitly, committed to anything as theoretically sophisticated as the tenets of Intuitionism. Rather, it is on the basis of 'what we all think' that this theory is built.

How might Kaspar defend his claim that, when the deliverances of a unified moral theory conflict with our moral intuitions, this is not only a strike against that theory, but a consideration in favor of Intuitionism? He could, I think, distinguish between two features of Intuitionism: its pluralism about moral principles, and its epistemological and metaphysical claims. It is reasonable to think that any problem for monism is, ipso facto, an argument for pluralism, but there is no reason to hold that such considerations support the other parts of the Intuitionist theory.

Further, the verdicts of theory and of common moral consciousness can be contrasted in at least two respects. First, the theory and common-sense morality might differ as to whether some particular action is right. Second, supposing they agree about what is right or wrong in such a case, they might disagree about why it is right or wrong. Kaspar, again following Ross, lays considerable emphasis on the second kind of case. If asked what is wrong with harming someone, or breaking a promise, the ordinary person will cite the harm, or the promise-breaking, as the reason. Reference to, say, the maximization of the good, will play no role in their reaching this verdict. Although I think this line of argument can be deployed in support of Intuitionism, it deserves more discussion than Kaspar gives it here. Both Kantians and consequentialists might accept his account of everyday moral thought. On this approach, neither the categorical imperative, nor the greatest happiness principle, need figure in the moral thinking of the ordinary person. Appeal to a supreme moral principle comes in only when the theoretician attempts to explain and justify that thought and, perhaps, to adjudicate in problem cases.

Understandably, most of the book is concerned with describing, defending, and developing Intuitionism, but a theory's strength can finally be assessed only in comparison with its rivals. Kaspar considers three: Kantianism, utilitarianism, and virtue theory. The discussions of all three are fairly dense and compressed; as a result, some objections are stated rather than argued for. For example, Kaspar claims that a number of immoral maxims successfully pass the Categorical Imperative test, without explaining how and why they do so.

This brings me to a general concern that I have with the level at which this book is written. It is part of the Bloomsbury Ethics series designed to "help students to explore, engage with, and master key topics in contemporary ethics". The book does start at a pretty introductory level, but fairly soon becomes technical and complex, and see-saws between levels of difficulty thereafter, as a result of which both types of treatment suffer. The introductory parts are sometimes over-simple and misleading, while the complex parts are not only inaccessible to the beginner, but often allusive and compressed in ways that make them hard to follow, even for someone familiar with the field.

I begin with an example of over-simplification. Kaspar introduces Intuitionism as "the moral theory which claims that you know what's right" (p. 2). Kaspar makes a similar claim at several places in the book, so he clearly regards it as useful. Slogans are helpful only insofar as they capture an essential feature of the position in a memorable way. This slogan seems to me a poor one, for a number of reasons. Intuitionism does not claim that we know what is right or wrong in any particular case (except when the case is a very clear one); it claims, as Kaspar elsewhere stresses, only that we know some general moral principles. But where is the implied contrast with other views? Kantians, utilitarians, and virtue theorists need not dissent. They can plausibly claim that we know that stealing, lying, cheating, and raping are wrong, without the aid of theory. The issue that divides them is whether a deeper justification or explanation is available or even needed. On this question, Intuitionism is as much a theory as any other.

In the central chapters, Kaspar seeks to develop Intuitionism to meet two challenges. The first is the (in)famous question of how moral properties supervene on natural or non-moral ones. I see no reason for puzzlement, but I am in a minority. Many contemporary discussions of this issue are a mess because of carelessness in posing the metaphysical issues. There is a great deal of sliding about between supervenience and resultance or emergence, between properties and instances of properties, between facts, things, properties, and states of affairs. Kaspar's discussion unfortunately falls into all these traps. He takes the question, to which a solution to the problem of supervenience would be an answer, to be: "Where in the world is morality?" (75). This is an unhelpful way of asking the question, and Kaspar seems to take it rather literally, with unfortunate results. He follows Russ Shafer-Landau in thinking that any instance of, say, generosity is constituted by those features of the act in virtue of which it is generous. One virtue of such a solution, Kaspar claims, is that 'it explains why the moral fact that A is W and the natural facts N1-N3 are in the same location. By N1-N3 constituting A is W, the two facts are co-extensive" (p. 89, my emphasis).

Kaspar's account of supervenience may explain one striking omission. Nowhere in the book is there any discussion of particularism. He just assumes that Intuitionism must be characterized in terms of a plurality of principles. This may stem from his adherence to what he calls the covariance thesis: "supervening properties not only depend on subvening properties, they covary with them" (p. 85). This "implies that moral properties will be present with natural properties in predictable ways" (p. 87). But the co-variance thesis is false. There can be no change in the supervening property without a change in the subvenient, but the converse does not hold.

In chapter 5, Kaspar seeks to develop the constitution account. My difficulty with all claims about property constitution is that I do not understand them. I know what it is for a table to be composed of atoms, or for bronze to constitute a statue, but I do not understand what is being claimed when similar remarks are made about properties or their instances. Fortunately, the interest of the view about moral kinds that Kaspar develops does not, I think, rest on such an account. He offers two central contentions: that "any moral property of any action is always based on some moral relation" (p. 99), and that the features in which rightness is grounded (surely a different relation from constitution) are themselves non-natural. Both claims have some plausibility.

The first, indeed, has a very lengthy history. Ross, whom Kaspar is following here, himself cites Samuel Clarke as an important influence. Both Ross and Kaspar's accounts fail, however, to distinguish two claims. The first is that rightness is itself a relation between, perhaps, an agent, an action, and a set of circumstances. It is right for S to A in circumstances C. The second is that some of our prima facie duties rest on, or are grounded in, actual social relations that hold between individuals. Some, but not all. That someone stands to me in the relationship of friend, child, spouse, or co-worker, is indeed, as Ross claims, morally significant. It may ground specific duties to them, and may also make the general duty I have to benefit people and to avoid harming them more weighty where my nearest and dearest are concerned.

But these general duties do not rest on actual social relationships; that I could benefit someone forms no social bond between us. This emerges, without Ross noticing its significance, in a famous passage in The Right and the Good. He there complains that "ideal utilitarianism" "seems to simplify unduly our relations to our fellows". It supposes that the only morally significant relation is that of "being possible beneficiaries by my action" (Oxford, 2002, p. 19 my emphasis). But all the other relations that Ross mentions are actual and not merely possible: relations "of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor" and so on. So while my obligations to my family or friends might plausibly be said to be grounded in our social relationships, this is not so when it comes to the duty to be beneficent. Here to say, as Kaspar does, that benefactor and beneficiary are in a "moral relation" is not to ground the duty of beneficence but simply to reiterate that we have such a duty. Some of the confusion here stems from Kaspar's strange terminology. As soon as two people meet, he holds, they enter various relations, such as the do-not-lie relation, and the do-not-harm relation (see, e.g., p. 141). But these are normative, not social, relations.

Most intriguingly, Kaspar suggests that not only rightness, but also the grounds of rightness might be non-natural (p. 100). I think there is something in this. It may well be that what makes an action right is to be spelled out in normative terms. What is wrong with my A-ing is that it would cause harm to the innocent, or that it would be an act of ingratitude and so on. He does not develop the point clearly, and its plausibility is somewhat obscured by the very strange argument he gives for its truth. "If only right is non-natural, then natural facts alone can explain why something is right. That would make the difference between non-natural moral realism and ethical naturalism appear negligible" (p. 100). I know of no naturalist or Intuitionist who thinks such a difference would be negligible.

Kaspar claims that "Morality is different from everything else" and that is why moral properties do not fit into a naturalist world-view (p. 76). In what way are they different? Most intuitionists hold that rightness and goodness are normative properties, and what is normative cannot be investigated by science. However, this is not Kaspar's view. 'Right' and 'good' are, in their primary use, descriptive, while 'ought' is quite different from them in being primarily normative. I confess to being unclear, on his account, why rightness and goodness are so clearly different from everything else in the natural world.

Kaspar's solution to the supervenience problem is very complex and compressed. I think his central claim is that there is a two-stage structure here. An act gets to be wrong by, say, being a lie. There are complex conditions governing what it is to be a lie, and any utterance that meets those conditions will be a lie. The ways in which an act can be a lie can be very different. But if some utterance is a lie and another is not the second must differ physically from the first in a way "sufficient to not constitute an act of lying" (p. 143). Hence, if one act is wrong because it is a lie, and another is not wrong, because it is not a lie, there must be some physical difference between them that grounds one being a lie and the other not. Apart from the rather tendentious use of the term 'physical' this seems to be right, but I cannot see that it is particularly novel, nor yet as complex as Kaspar's account suggests.

Both Ross and Prichard deny that right actions can also be intrinsically valuable. Kaspar rightly rejects their arguments. The state of affairs in which I keep my promise, say, is more valuable than one in which I do not. But doesn't this concession enable the consequentialist to steal the deontologist's clothes? If lying, harming, being ungrateful, etc. are very disvaluable, then such acts will maximize value only in pretty extreme circumstances. Kaspar flirts with the possibility of a rapprochement between the two theories, but ultimately rejects it claiming, without further argument, that the injunction to maximize value cannot be the only principle. Throughout the discussion, he identifies his target as utilitarianism (he mentions consequentialism in a footnote). But utilitarianism is, of course, only one species of consequentialism, and the conflation leads him astray at several points.

Finally, which principles should appear on an intuitionist's list of self-evident principles? Intriguingly, Kaspar suggests that there will be many. "'Murder is wrong,' Assaulting is wrong,' and 'Rape is wrong' are all self-evident on my view. They cannot be reduced to or fully explained by 'Harming others is wrong'" (p. 174). It is unfortunate that he does not find space to explain why he thinks they are irreducible.

The reader might wonder whether ‘Murder is wrong’ (an example Kaspar frequently uses) is not too true to be good, being merely analytic. Kaspar’s reply is that ‘Murder is wrong’ is ambiguous between murder being conventionally wrong, and its being naturally wrong, where the latter claim is synthetic. He does not explain this gnomic utterance. He adds that it is doubtful that “murder” can be defined as “wrongful killing” since ‘manslaughter is also wrongful killing [and] this would commit us to holding that “manslaughter is murder”’ (p. 69). The relevance of this remark is unclear. The objection holds merely that ‘murder is wrong’ is analytic; it is not claiming to offer a full analysis, i.e. definition, of murder. So Kaspar’s riposte misses the mark. Just as it is analytic that ‘bachelors are unmarried’, even though there are unmarried women, so it can be analytic that ‘murder is wrongful killing’, even though there are other forms of wrongful killing.

This slip is, unfortunately, not isolated but symptomatic of a more widespread carelessness. For example: "consider . . . pleasure, which many naturalists have asserted to be the natural property identical to moral rightness. To see if morality is identical to pleasure  . . ." (p. 82).

I regret that I cannot recommend this book to students both because they would find many parts confusing or impenetrable, but also because of its lack of care and accuracy. There are many excellent encyclopedia entries on the topic from which they would learn far more. Nor, I think, will it help the more knowledgeable. Kaspar opens up some interesting lines of enquiry, such as his suggestion about moral kinds, but these are insufficiently worked out for their promise to be clearly assessed.