Invasive Technification: Critical Essays in the Philosophy of Technology

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Gernot Böhme, Invasive Technification: Critical Essays in the Philosophy of Technology, Cameron Shingleton (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2012, 261pp., $32.95, ISBN 9781441182944.

Reviewed by Andrew Feenberg, Simon Fraser University


This book covers a vast range of issues in the philosophy of technology with clarity and insight. It is divided into six chapters, each of which contains several short essays on related subjects. The chapters address the relation of science to technology, different types of technologies, the technification of human relations and nature, and critical approaches to technology. The theme is clear from the title, although Gernot Böhme is not as technophobic as it implies. However, he is concerned with tracing the profound impact of technical mediation on every aspect of modern social life including, among many others, production, consumption, perception, communication, medicine, education. The technological "invasion" of all these domains transforms what it means to be human for better and for worse. Just how humanity will end up is an open question in Böhme's view. He is rather pessimistic, finding few resources in contemporary culture that could support a positive outcome.

Böhme begins with a rather off-putting review of the philosophy of technology, a field he finds sadly lacking. He notes that "a true philosophy of technology hardly exists" (14). He is certainly correct that there is no agreement, no "paradigm," among philosophers on this as on other subjects,. But many of his arguments concerning the broad impact of technology on humanity and nature have been rehearsed in different terms by a wide variety of thinkers. His key point is well understood: technology is not a neutral instrument but forms the basis of human life, which in modern times it radically transforms. A brief look at the contents of the journal Techné might have changed his overly negative view of the field.

In the second chapter he proceeds to explain the technification of the lifeworld as the essential project of modern times. This project goes beyond Weberian rationalization, which still concerned the efficiency of means, to transform the human self-relation and the very meaning of nature. It extends to social institutions, as well as to natural conditions, and everywhere alters meanings, as well as carrying out functions. Böhme gives a number of examples of the cultural impact of technology, such as the separation of sexuality from reproduction. The outcome is dispiriting, "the splitting off of instrumentally rational action from a humanly fulfilling life" (39). But Böhme is not completely pessimistic. He understands that technological advance has had emancipatory consequences and could have far more in the future. This chapter, like the others, contains several more essays loosely related to this basic theme. But for reasons of space I will skip to the next chapters.

In chapter three Böhme ingeniously complicates our picture of technology by considering the history of our understanding of and uses for mechanical devices. Until modern times, technical activity was directed at least as much toward amusement as toward production. The exclusive focus on production characterizes only a short phase in the history of technology, a phase ending now as technical gadgetry becomes a focus of attention and a mighty economic engine. Consumer society introduces a new spirit that in fact recapitulates in a different environment many traditional attitudes toward technology.

In the chapter on the technification of human relations, Böhme shows that technology is so deeply implicated in human life that "technological action is always already social action" (112). Thus it is not correct to view society as standing in a relation to technology: society is technological through and through. And the reverse is true: technology is created not only in conformity with natural law, but also under social norms. The implications of this view for philosophical anthropology are far reaching. One can no longer define the human ahistorically because as technology changes so do the humans who use it. Böhme next proceeds to trace the transformations undergone by such basic anthropological categories as perception and the body.

His discussion of nature follows the same lines, but his argument is confined to modern times. Until recently, the independence of nature from human purposes could be taken for granted. But increasingly nature is incorporated into the social world through the modern technological project and its many successful applications. The contrast between nature and artifice loses its meaning. Böhme extends the argument about external nature to the nature that we are ourselves, i.e., the human body, which is no longer a simply given facticity but has become subject to technological transformation. The self-relation of modern human beings is also transformed by the possibility of intervention. All this undermines resistance to technification, which can no longer plausibly demand a return to natural ways. Böhme relates this outcome to what Walter Benjamin called the "loss of the aura," extended now from the domain of art to nature.

Böhme organizes the concluding chapter around the relation of his own critical theory of technology to the now-classical Critical Theory of the Frankfurt School. He argues that Critical Theory from the very beginning was committed to the idea of a rational society, an objective condition that satisfied a normative criterion of the good. But its conception of rationality was based on the Marxist idea of socialism, which no longer has much appeal. In the early phase, Critical Theory was further limited by a restriction of critique to social issues, leaving science and technology to the experts. Later, in Dialectic of Enlightenment, Horkheimer and Adorno recognized the significance of technification. They now identify rationality and instrumental control, at least under modern conditions, and so destroy the very possibility of an objective ideal of a rational society. The attempt of Habermas and others to salvage the rational subject from the wreckage of objective rationality offers no perspective on technology and its impacts.

This section concludes with reflections on the possibility of reviving a notion of objective rationality through arguments around environmentally compatible technology and related notions of a technology compatible with human dignity. But Böhme is skeptical. At the end of the chapter he reviews cultural resources for the reform of technology and finds them wanting, at least in the West. Invasive technology has left us without guides to the future in our tradition. Thus, despite his initial affirmation of the emancipatory consequences of technification, his conclusion is rather pessimistic. In this he is an ambivalent successor to Heidegger and Jacques Ellul, thinkers whose unqualified anti-modernism he rejects.

Böhme is wonderful at clearly posing the questions and dilemmas faced by philosophy of technology. His many analyses of specific examples are full of insight. His book definitely advances the argument and will no doubt inspire criticism and response. I would like to conclude in that spirit. I have two main doubts about the technification thesis. These concern the rather unqualified concept of technification, and the concluding discussion of Critical Theory.

Is technification a singular process? I am not so sure. A hint of technological determinism lingers behind this notion. Empirical study shows a great deal of contingency in technological development, a point that Böhme admits in principle, but for which he finds little application.

Consider the case of the Internet, which he does not discuss in any detail, although it is clearly an example of the problematic that interests him. The system was originally designed for military purposes and scientific research. Once released to the public it was transformed in unexpected ways. The Internet as we know it is the product of many social forces, some of them military, others corporate, and a great many popular in the sense that they are due to successful private initiatives of individuals with few resources beyond their skills. Among the latter is almost everything having to do with human communication on the Internet.

The enormous variety of communicative needs to which the Internet responds cannot be reduced to Böhme's few rather negative comments on the technification of human relations. Alongside losses in terms of intimacy, there are gains in the creation of new social forms bringing together individuals such as medical patients, otherwise isolated from each other and helpless before the medical institution, or the well known political usages exemplified in the Occupy Movement and the Arab Spring. I do not think it is possible to understand these phenomena from the standpoint of an argument that sees in technification "the qualitative destruction of what it once was to be a human being" (224). Plenty of humans are attempting to defend their humanity on the Internet in opposition to various forms of domination, economic, political, and cultural.

This example is related to my disagreement with Böhme regarding the Frankfurt School. I have two problems with his essentially dismissive critique. In the first place, Horkheimer did not propose socialism as a speculative ideal but believed that in advocating it he was responding to a century of workers' struggles and demands. One can of course doubt that socialism is a correctly interpreted goal of those historical movements, but it was in any case understood as such by the early Frankfurt School. We are in no better or worse position philosophically with respect to the formulation of the ideal of a rational society on the basis of the demands of social movements. To be sure, we are at an early stage in the development of those movements, and we have no compact and unified subject such as the proletariat on which to base projections of the future. But we do have struggles, and we can interpret them as the Frankfurt School did in its day. Böhme himself seems on the verge of doing this in his concluding chapter but holds back.

Secondly, I disagree with his historical account of the Frankfurt School, but on this score I admit I'm in a small minority. Böhme says that Horkheimer accepted a positivist understanding of natural science and that "the entire critical theoretic tradition followed suit" (185). He briefly concedes that Marcuse later raised the possibility of a critical theory of technology, but somehow this point disappears from the subsequent argument, which leaves us with the impression that nothing significant happened in the history of the Frankfurt School between Dialectic of Enlightenment and Habermas. This is a drastic simplification that can only mean Böhme accepts the now fashionable eclipse of Marcuse.

It is easy to forget that for ten years Marcuse was the leading figure associated with the Frankfurt School. His contribution may not have been appreciated in Frankfurt, but he had a very wide audience everywhere else. One of the reasons was his attention to the very issue of technology that concerns Böhme. He was too early to place the issue on an enduring basis, but his work represents a significant milestone in the evolution of a critical theory of technology. A great deal of contemporary critique that presents itself as original is anticipated in its general lines by Marcuse's late writings, from One-Dimensional Man to Counter-Revolution and Revolt.

Of course, the basis of his argument is different from Böhme's. Marcuse still believed that capitalism was responsible for perpetuating the rule of an elite through its control of technological advance. Technological design was contingent, he argued, on class power and reproduced class power, suppressing human and natural potentials that could become the basis for a better way of life. That argument opened the possibility that democratic control of technology might lead to a very different outcome from the one Böhme fears. My own critical theory of technology pursues Marcuse's argument under present conditions.

Oddly, Böhme himself argues along similar lines in the discussion of computers in education that follows his critique of the Frankfurt School. He notes the role of corporations in pushing the computerization of education at the expense of developing more important human capacities. In this essay, technification does not appear as an autonomous force but as driven by political economy, and humanity does not appear as totally malleable but as possessing inherent potentials. Marcuse could not have said it better.

Marcuse was aware of the decline of the working class and the emergence of other democratic forces such as the environmental and feminist movements, to which we could add a number of other more recent ones. He hoped that such movements would someday spark a general transformation of the technical basis of modern civilization. These are still the only sources of resistance to the worst consequences of technification. If I understand him correctly, Böhme shares this hope with diminished confidence in the future. I wish he had recognized Marcuse's critique of technology as an important predecessor and argued against it when he disagreed.