Inventions of the Imagination: Romanticism and Beyond

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Richard T. Gray, Nicholas Halmi, Gary J. Handwerk, Michael A. Rosenthal, Klaus A. Vieweg (eds.), Inventions of the Imagination: Romanticism and Beyond, University of Washington Press, 2011, 194pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780295990996.

Reviewed by Dalia Nassar, University of Sydney and Villanova University


While it is widely known that the imagination played a significant role in romanticism, recent philosophical interpretations of romanticism have emphasized the significance of reason in romantic thought, and in this way made a significant correction to the view of romanticism as irrational or anti-rational. In doing so, however, these interpretations have often overlooked or under-thematized the imagination. Thus, although historians of philosophy underscore the central role of the work of art in romantic thought, there has not been a rigorous interrogation of the ways in which the romantics conceived of the imagination, or of their understanding of the relation between imagination, reason and intuition.

This collection thus makes an important contribution to the study of romanticism, and in particular to the study of romantic philosophy. It contains contributions by both literary critics and philosophers, and the styles and goals of the essays vary accordingly. While some are philosophical analyses of particular questions, others seek to explicate the role of the imagination in particular philosophical projects or systems, while still others interpret specific poems, or offer illuminating comparisons between poets or movements in poetry.

As the author of the Introduction, Richard T. Gray, explains, the collection's title is purposefully ambiguous. The "inventions of the imagination," he writes, should be understood in both senses of the phrase -- that is to say, the imagination as both inventor and invented (3). The more philosophical essays seek to understand the imagination as inventor, and thus investigate the workings of the imagination and its role, above all, in knowledge and interpretation. The more literary essays are concerned with explicating the actual inventions of the imagination -- the literary works. However, several essays cross disciplinary boundaries and accomplish both tasks.

One of the key philosophical questions addressed in a number of the essays concerns the relationship between imagination and knowledge. Is the imagination an essential element in epistemic operations, or is it the inventor of fantasy and fiction? This directly leads to a second, closely related, question. Is the imagination free and thus "arbitrary" (79), or is it unfree, such that it remains confined to the sphere and goals of objective knowledge and reason? Put differently, is the imagination necessarily fragmentary, and thus opposed to the systematic goals of reason? What kinds of truth claims can the imagination make, and how can they be verified?

Not surprisingly, the authors do not agree on the majority of these questions, and in some instances, they strongly disagree. What does it mean, exactly, to say that the imagination can generate knowledge or, by contrast, disrupts the activity of knowing? In what follows, I will focus on the essays which are most clearly concerned with this question.

The first two essays take up the question of knowledge directly, offering compelling evidence of ways in which imagination and literature can and have benefitted the study of nature and science. In "Imagination on the Move," Wolfgang Welsch argues that to achieve knowledge of the natural world, empirical perception does not suffice. Imagination is necessary, he contends, because it is only through the imagination that one can arrive at a temporal perspective and thereby grasp natural development and change. The imagination allows the knower to develop a "genealogical film," or a "cinema of evolution," which relativises her momentary perception (19). For this reason, Welsch says, "imagination, not direct perception, provides the truth" (19).

Georg Braungart's "The Poetics of Nature: Literature and Constructive Imagination in the History of Geology" similarly explicates the potential of the imagination to generate knowledge. However, rather than offering an analysis of the workings of the imagination, Braungart provides a historical account of the role of literature in the production of specific kinds of knowledge. The case he examines is geology (29). In the same vein as Welsch, Braungart claims that it is only through the work of the imagination that geologists were able to "construct" the history of the earth:

geologists and palaeontologists . . . needed a good deal of imagination or Einbildungskraft (the power to create an image of something) not only to seek the remains of former life forms, but also to guide them in piecing these petrified bones together, imagining them covered with flesh and skin, and even conceiving an entire biography or novel -- if not an 'epic' -- about these fragments they dug out of the ground (30).

Although Welsch and Braungart's essays display a deep agreement on the role and significance of the imagination in epistemic processes, their terminological differences may indicate other significant disagreement. Does the imagination, as Welsch maintains, "show" us the world in a way that is inaccessible to perception and reason (20)? Or does it, as Braungart puts it, "construct" the world (29)? Welsch and Braungart may not intend any difference in meaning, but the fact that neither offers an explication of these terms points to potential misunderstanding. Is there a difference between "showing" and "constructing"? How does the imagination both apprehend and construct the world?

In line with the first two essays, Beth Lord's "Between Imagination and Reason: Kant and Spinoza on Fictions" describes the essentially epistemic role of the imagination. However, in contrast to Welsch and Braungart, Lord claims that the imagination produces "fictions," which are necessary for the achievement of systematic ideals. Lord's view is that Kant and Spinoza's ideas of a necessary fiction precede (and influence) the romantic fragment: "for both Kant and Spinoza, these anti-systematic fictions are systematically necessary for understanding the whole, and are therefore necessary for the practice of philosophy" (27). While Kant's use of these positive fictions is well-charted territory, Lord's claim that Spinoza makes similar use of the products of the imaginations is novel, and in some ways problematic. As Lord sees it, it is only through the imagination that Spinoza is able to make "a leap out of reason and into intuition," i.e., the third kind of knowledge (43). This seems deeply at odds with the "eminently rational" Spinoza (43), for whom imagination is the lowest kind of knowledge. Why would Spinoza rely on the products of the imagination for the completion of his rational system? In turn, what (if any) significance can the third kind of knowledge have within Lord's interpretation of Spinoza? If the goal is to become rational (44), then why is it necessary to employ the imagination, to undertake a "leap," in order to arrive at an apparently non-rational kind of knowledge?

Michael Forster's "Herder on Interpretation and Imagination" offers a clear argument for the need of imagination in theories of interpretation and hermeneutics. Forster first defends the role of the imagination in understanding, against Frege and Wittengstein's anti-psychologism (57-8), and goes on to outline the role of the imagination, in particular Einfühlung, in Herder's theory of interpretation. Most significantly, Forster illustrates that through the imagination the interpreter can gain "access to another person's (perceptual and affective) sensations," without, however, needing to commit herself to the other person's conceptual worldview (63). In this way, Forster argues, the interpreter can avoid Gadamerian skepticism -- the view that the understanding always involves pre-understanding (63) -- and its consequence, that understanding can only be gained through a commitment to the other's worldview, i.e., understanding is agreement. The imagination, Forster maintains, enables access to the other without requiring conceptual agreement with the other's views (64).

The relationship between the imagination and freedom, and, in turn, the imagination and the political state, comes to the fore in Wilhelm Voßkamp's "Imaginative Power as Prerequisite for an Aesthetics of Freedom in Friedrich Schiller's Works." What distinguishes the imagination for Schiller, Voßkamp argues, is its "boundless 'determinability,'" its ability to play and freely associate (81). By emphasizing the infinitely determinable, free aspect of the imagination, Voßkamp seeks to legitimize the transition from aesthetics to politics -- from artistic creativity to political activity. For it is in the aesthetic frame of mind that the human being is able to experience her freedom, allowing her "to make the transition to an 'aesthetic State' (in the political sense)" (82-3).

Although the next two articles focus on Hegel, they portray two radically different ways of approaching Hegel and the imagination. Klaus Vieweg's "The Gentle Force over Pictures: Hegel's Philosophical Conception of the Imagination" is a careful analysis of what Hegel says about the imagination. Vieweg outlines the three stages of imagination as presented in the Encyclopedia -- reproductive imagination, fantasy, and appearance -- and offers clear explications of the ways in which Hegel arrives at his views.

In contrast, Robert Pippin's "The Status of Literature in Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit: On the Lives of Concepts" is concerned not with what Hegel says about the imagination but with his use of it in the Phenomenology. Pippin's question is a significant one -- after all, Hegel's repeated use of symbols, images, and literature seems to suggest a more favorable view of the imagination than Hegel's explicit position. How, then, is a reader of the Phenomenology to understand Hegel's reliance on literary allusions to arrive at philosophical points? Pippin offers some very interesting passages to support his claim that "it is only in such representative attempts at self-knowledge . . . that the norm can be said to 'live'" (119). That is to say, it is only in the image that the concept comes to life, and, in turn, it is only through an engagement with this "historical and living geistige Wirklichkeit" that "any genuine philosophy" can arise (119). This controversial and compelling claim begins to make sense not only of Hegel's conclusion to the Phenomenology -- a misquotation of a part of Schiller's poem "Freundschaft" -- but also of the Phenomenology as a whole. Yet, the claim comes at the end of the essay, and the reader is left to wonder about its consequences: what does the claim that it is only in the representation that the concept comes to life imply for the concept? And how can we reconcile this view with the more common one that, to quote Vieweg, "the true iconoclasm of conceptual thought, as Hegel conceives it, remains beyond the reach of the imagination" (99)?

Richard Block's "From Art to History: Schelling's Modern Mythology and the Coming Community" returns to the question of the relation between imagination and the political, but, in contrast to Voßkamp, argues that the imagination can only offer a semblance of community. By looking at Schelling's edits and footnotes to the last section of the System of Transcendental Idealism, Block locates "an absence of identity," an "ontological reversal, whereby the Abglanz (deflection), or what Schelling calls a Widerschein (reflection), is prior to an identity it apparently reflects" (148) -- bringing to mind Manfred Frank and Gerhard Kurz's "ordo inversus." Block concludes that rather than establishing or presenting an original unity, the work of art seeks "to confirm that unity is nothing but a semblance or Abglanz of that unity" (154). Although Block's reliance on the footnotes and edits offers new insights into Schelling's conclusions -- which in some ways make sense of Schelling's turn away from the work of art after 1800 -- the idea of an absence of identity does not comfortably fit with either the body of the last sections of the System, or with Schelling's later writings from that period. How, for instance, is one to understand Schelling's insistence on locating identity in reason in his 1801 Darstellung meines Systems der Philosophie? Could it not be the case that Schelling came to view the work of art as incapable of presenting identity -- as Block argues -- and thus turned his attention to locating identity in reason and intellectual intuition?

The concluding essay, Christoph Bode's "'To impose is not to discover': a Romantic-Modernist Continuity in Contradiction," offers a good summation of some of the key questions regarding the epistemic nature of the imagination and makes an important contribution to understanding connections between Romanticism and Modernism. In works by Blake, Keats and Shelley -- the representatives of Romanticism -- and Frost, H. D. and Wallace Stevens -- as key figures in Modernism -- Bode locates an ambivalent relation to and oscillating view of the imagination. Does the imagination discover or does it invent? Does it reveal the world as it is, or does it construct the world? While some of his interpretations do not accord with the author's self-understanding, as he himself notes in the case of H. D. (173), Bode's essay elaborates the fundamental question concerning the epistemic nature of the imagination and its ability to generate truth or disclose reality.

In these essays, the imagination appears under many (and at times conflicting) guises. Is the imagination a faculty of apprehending, or a faculty of creating? Can apprehension and creation go hand in hand? How does the imagination relate to conceptual thought? Does the imagination work in concert with or in contrast to reason? While no one essay takes up these questions in their entirety, the collection as a whole provides ample material for thinking about the epistemic role of the imagination. In this way it makes an important contribution not only to the history of philosophy and the study of romanticism, but also to contemporary questions in hermeneutics, theories of knowledge and aesthetics. My hope is that this collection will revive interest in the cognitive value of the imagination and its role in the generation of different forms of knowledge.