Iris Murdoch and the Art of Imaging

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Marije Altorf, Iris Murdoch and the Art of Imaging, Continuum, 2008, 150pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497574.

Reviewed by Sharin N. Elkholy, University of Houston


The general public often knows more about the personal lives of female artists and thinkers than their actual achievements.  This is likely the case with philosopher and novelist Iris Murdoch who was the subject of a recent film, Iris (2001), based on her relationship with John Bayley and her bout with Alzheimer's disease. One of the first women to study philosophy at Cambridge, along with Elizabeth Anscombe, Mary Midgley, Philippa Foot and Mary Warnock, Murdoch went on to teach philosophy, making little of her status as a woman in a field dominated by men. Instead, Murdoch broke with the analytic tradition she studied and became the first thinker to write in English on the existentialism of Jean-Paul Sartre, paving the road for the independent approach she would later take to philosophical problems. Increasingly unsatisfied with Sartre's philosophical account of the meaning of existence, Murdoch turned to literature, her own, to explore human relationships and, above all, morality. Murdoch is the author of dozens of novels, numerous plays, poetry and philosophical texts.

In Iris Murdoch and the Art of Imaging, Marije Altorf explores the relationship between philosophy and literature in Murdoch's thought. She argues that while there has been some consideration regarding the influence of Murdoch's philosophy on her literature, little attention has been paid to the influence of Murdoch's fiction on her philosophical work. Through an exploration of Murdoch's use of imagery, Altorf works to portray the distinctiveness of Murdoch's approach to philosophy and morality. Altorf believes that through a study of Murdoch's literature the reader may arrive at her vision of philosophical truths and the forms of morality she deems valuable.

Writing literature allowed Murdoch to explore the intricacies and ambiguities of human existence in ways she was unable to in her philosophical writings. Altorf argues that Murdoch's conception of literature serves as the springboard for her philosophical positions, as well as the source of her criticisms of contemporary existentialism and philosophy of language. Observing the changes in Murdoch's imagery and metaphors, Altorf suggests, one can gauge the development of Murdoch's thought, culminating in her understanding of the role of the imagination and fantasy with regard to the "Good." Murdoch's notion of the "Good" is hard to decipher and the reader will not gain a definite sense of this idea in Altorf's study. Perhaps, however, this is not so much Altorf's fault as it is a problem in Murdoch's work, since Altorf also expresses her frustration over what she perceives as Murdoch's "empty character of the Good." (112) Altorf writes, "In preferring the universal to the actual Murdoch at times appears as a philosopher who has only just returned to the cave and whose eyes still need to adjust to the darkness." (111) Yet Altorf's study highlights, to the contrary, Murdoch's emphasis on the particular, specifically with regard to the diversity of human relationships and the depths of individual character.

Altorf utilizes the methodological framework of Michele Le Doeuff to discuss Murdoch's use of metaphor to shed light on the human condition. According to Le Doeuff, images either signal difficulties in the text that require a justification, or stand where a justification would have been warranted. Drawing on Le Doeuff's framework, Altorf examines the relationship between literature and philosophy in Murdoch's work by focusing on Murdoch's use of imagery to reveal her notion of moral goodness and her philosophical perspective.

However, Altorf's book is partly a collection of previously published essays, some of which do not draw heavily on Murdoch's literature. Therefore the reader should expect to find a range of topics covered pertaining to Murdoch and her work. In addition to arguing that philosophical truths and forms of morality are revealed in Murdoch's literature, Altorf also, for example, discusses Murdoch's work and life within a feminist context of women philosophers and their place within the practice of philosophy.

In her analysis of Murdoch's "The Idea of Perfection", Altorf shows how Murdoch's use of imagery enables her both to criticize tenets upheld by analytic philosophers, as well as to discuss a certain picture of the good. Altorf reveals the uniqueness of Murdoch's thought -- her awe for the singularity of each human existence and her idea that moral goodness is an ongoing process -- through a reading of Murdoch's example of the change in a mother's perspective on her son's fiancé. M, the mother, does not approve of her soon to be daughter-in-law, D. She finds her undignified and uncouth, lacking the proper accent, mannerisms and attire. One day D, the daughter-in-law, disappears from M's life. This gives M enough time to re-conceive of D no longer as a simpleton, but as simple and spontaneous. This change of vision comes about without any external prompting and is what Murdoch considers to be good; as Altorf puts it, the change yields "a better picture of D." (63) In this example, Murdoch illustrates that one can never completely know an individual because there is always more to a person than meets the eye. Otherness occasions a failure in the imagination, writes Altorf. (79)

This image of M's metamorphosis demonstrates Murdoch's commitment to the idea of a rich inner life that stands in contrast to the rejection of such life by analytic philosophers.  Consider:

If D had been there all along, it is easy to picture how M might have changed her mind for a variety of reasons: M may feel obliged to defend her son's choice against neighbours or colleagues; both women could get more used to one another; M accepts the situation out of love for her son, etc. (63-64)

But Murdoch makes a great effort to show that M's vision of D changed while D was completely out of the picture so to underscore that the change occurred in M's mind alone. Moreover, because of M's refinement she had always been acting graciously and respectfully towards D. Thus the change in M's perception of D was not concomitant with any change in her outward behavior. The change in perception that M underwent came about in complete isolation from anyone else and all external circumstances. Murdoch uses the image of this change to reveal the significance of the inner life against the demands made by analytic philosophers that change be explained by reference to circumstances situated in an independent reality. This concern with forms of experience that are empirically unverifiable is a constant in Murdoch's thought.

In her chapter titled "Imagination", Altorf explains Murdoch's division of imagination into "bad fantasy" and "good imagination." Fantasy involves an egoistic concern with oneself that often draws false pictures and engages in the practice of self-centered, wishful thinking. Good imagination, to the contrary, is able to arrive at certainties but is often able to explain neither how it has done so, nor the nature of the certainties themselves. Murdoch does not accept the relegation of the imagination to the passive side of the mind. Building her theory in contrast to the role of the imagination in Kant and Plato, Murdoch believes that we are imagining all of the time. Imagination affects all cognition and perception and is central to our lived existence, as we inhabit a world not of facts but of our own creation. Furthermore, she highlights how we often know things that we cannot explain, things that go beyond mere facts. Yet Altorf recognizes, somewhat disapprovingly, that Murdoch nevertheless has an implicit sense that the world is a certain way and that the way of the world is known to all. In fact, according to Murdoch, a person cannot be good unless they have some sense of what others are experiencing in the world and this comes from having an understanding of the world as certain.

Altorf explains what she perceives to be the difficulty with this approach. Responding to a passage from Murdoch's "On 'God' and 'Good'" where Murdoch explains that morality rests on a kind of realism, Altorf writes: " So the good man must be aware of his surroundings, but what are these 'certain' things? What things? Surely not facts?" (70) Altorf then shows how Murdoch, rather than provide an argument to support her claim that morality is a form of realism, true to her style, turns to an image. Murdoch draws on Rilke's observation that Cezanne's paintings do not depict the world as he sees it, but as it is. He did not paint "'I like it', he painted 'There it is.'" (70) But again, Altorf questions what exactly Murdoch means by the use of this image to support the idea that there is only one reality that is accessible to all equally. For example, she describes how Murdoch believes that it is obvious to everyone that Shakespeare is the greatest of all artists. Murdoch also believes Tolstoy's greatness to be self-evident. In response to Murdoch's reference to Rilke, Altorf notes that Cezanne was not a photorealist but a post-Impressionist painter.

Murdoch, therefore, uses art to reflect upon morality and sees morality reflected in art. Asserting that there is a link between art and moral goodness, Murdoch claims that a careful consideration of great art reveals to the critic what is good about human action and also allows access to "truth." Here the good seems to be revealed in a sort of presentation that the observer can recognize as certain, yet may not be able to explain. Since Murdoch believes that moral ideals are ordinary and obvious, they do not need complex theorizing. Altorf consequently discusses Murdoch's objection to the widely held philosophical notion that the unexamined life is not worth living. She states that for Murdoch artists may portray moral ideals and actions that are not amenable to exact explanation. Thus we get a sense that it is perhaps through the imagination that one confronts the limits of imaging. Altorf's work opens an exploration of this notion as well as other intricacies of Murdoch's thinking, which will, I hope, prompt the reader to explore the depths of Murdoch's wide array of writings.