Iris Murdoch, Gender and Philosophy

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Sabina Lovibond, Iris Murdoch, Gender and Philosophy, Routledge, 2011, 152pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415429993.

Reviewed by Nora Hämäläinen, University of Helsinki


In her recent book Iris Murdoch, Gender and Philosophy Sabina Lovibond confronts the cultural "imaginary" which, she suggests, still today presents the woman philosopher as something of an anomaly, a discredited other. She does this by means of a critical discussion of the work of another woman philosopher, Iris Murdoch, whose writings, both philosophical and literary, she perceives as persistently complicit in an imagery of male dominance, in spite of explicit avowals of sympathy for "women's liberation".

Lovibond's suggestion is that if we attend to what she sees as a conservative, anti-egalitarian aspect of Murdoch's thought, we may learn something about how this imagery works in our culture and how it can be overcome. Her explicit intention is not to press charges against Murdoch, but in the course of her argument there is less of that general lesson and more of a sustained argument aimed at exposing Murdoch's lack of feminist sympathy. In the context of contemporary philosophy, where Murdoch's work is either neglected or treated with reverence, this critical interest is more than welcome. Lovibond's book is also sharp, well-written and exposes a serious, urgent real-life interest in its theoretical subject matter. It is also extremely thought provoking, although (or perhaps since) I find myself disagreeing with Lovibond, partly or completely, at nearly every juncture of her interpretation of Murdoch.

The book is structured in four chapters: the first presents the overall agenda of the discredited position of woman thinkers in the imagery of western philosophy, and a 'testimonial injustice' afflicting woman philosophers in this context. In Chapter 2 she traces Murdoch's covertly anti-feminist philosophical agenda back to her great inspiration Simone Weil, and what she sees as Weil's self-denigrating idea of moral goodness. Chapter 3 contains readings of Murdoch's novels, with the aim of showing how her literary imagery affirms a worldview where the philosopher, the sage, and the intellectual master is a man, while the humble, submissive and unexamined life is represented by a woman. Finally, in the fourth chapter entitled "What is she afraid of?" Lovibond investigates what she takes to be Murdoch's deep but unaccounted for attachment to the imagery of male dominance and female submission, which is in Lovibond's view closely connected to her idea of eros.

There are several partly distinct charges against Murdoch presented in the book. I will only discuss the two I find most relevant for a further appropriation of Murdoch's ideas in contemporary ethics. The first relates to the moral and philosophical consequences of Murdoch's emphasis on the inner life, while the other traces Murdoch's tastes and motivations as a literary artist.

Murdoch's moral philosophy

From the mid-twentieth century on Murdoch argued that modern philosophy, both in its analytic and French existentialist guises, is overly concerned with action and choice, operating with a naïve conception of the will and the idea of a liberal freely choosing agent, producing a picture of morality which is narrow and biased and ultimately unhelpful in relation to the complexities of our moral lives. She wants to replace this thin understanding of the moral agent with a richer idea of a moral person with an inner life and morally significant movements of consciousness.

In the past decades, Murdoch's work has been appropriated by woman philosophers who have found her emphases concerning moral philosophy and personhood more illuminating than those of her action-centered contemporaries. Lovibond cites Megan Laverty who has put forward Murdoch's work as a "feminist intervention in the masculine bias that has historically dominated romantic thinking" (p. 3). Indeed, as Lovibond points out, the dubious hero of modern moral philosophy and literature, criticized by Murdoch -- "free independent, lonely, powerful, rational, responsible, brave" -- is certainly male, and "her examples of genuine virtue, too, often seem calculated to reproach philosophy for its habitual neglect of women's experience" (p. 3).

But the particular interest in the inner life seems, for Murdoch herself, to have little to do with gendered sensitivities. She is certainly not a philosopher of womanliness, or a specifically feminist philosopher. In Lovibond's view she wants, essentially, to be above such things. In an interview, cited by Lovibond, she states that,

I think I want to write about things on the whole where it doesn't matter whether you're male or female, in which case you'd better be male, because a male represents ordinary human beings, unfortunately, as things stand at the moment, whereas a woman is always a woman! (p. 5)

Murdoch's appeal here to a gender neutral (male) outlook may be found deeply disturbing for contemporary feminist sensibilities. Yet, there are plenty of passages in writings and interviews where she takes a thoroughly uncompromised and sharp posture in favor of gender equality. She has, furthermore, made way for a perspective on ethics which many woman philosophers have found deeply needed in twentieth-century ethics, including love, attention and self-forgetfulness in the ethical repertoire. But Lovibond is not convinced. She reasons the other way around: it is precisely by articulating an ethical perspective which elevates some of the virtues of traditional femininity that Murdoch becomes problematic from a feminist point of view. A main source of the problem here, as Lovibond perceives it, is the influence of Simone Weil, and her concept of "attention", with all that goes with it:

Murdoch is heedful of Weil's teaching in ethics, religion and politics alike . . . but her most self-conscious borrowings are centred on the themes of attention andobedience. For Weil the concept of attention has a general epistemological significance not limited to ethics: active enquiry, strenuous attempts at problem solving, are in her view over-rated, serving only to 'clear the ground'; they are low grade phenomena tainted by the 'heat of the chase', the egoistic wish not to have wasted our labour. By contrast there is a kind of attention which is bound up not with the will but with our consent to receive illumination or insight. (p. 29)

The good person, according to this picture, must above all have humility; she must learn to stand back and wait. She must let things happen, and attend to them, receive, rather than rush in and do things. "Unselfing" is a key word. This emphasis was fresh and unusual in Murdoch's context of mid- and late-twentieth century Anglo-American secular moral philosophy, but as Lovibond suggests, this kind of selfless attention, attendance, and suppression of the impulse to act are precisely what has traditionally been expected of women. It is a good description of the internalized feminine ideal which has made women more easily manageable in patriarchal societies.

It could be argued, against Lovibond, that the submissive gesture of Weil's ethical perspective is of a radical Christian rather than conservative bent. The demandingness of her ethics of attention to the other is far beyond any conventional roles of socially conditioned self-denigration. The figure she evokes is the warrior-angel or martyr-saint, rather than the mother, wife or muse. In this extremity of spirit it occupies, arguably, a slot which is genderless and always adversarial to habitual relations of power. There is further no gender bias in either Weil's or Murdoch's views of whom this ideal applies to. It is meant equally for men and for women, as an arid universal prescription. Thus Weil's influence surely cannot be read as a slide back to a conservative setting?

But Weil's radicalism is precisely what Lovibond finds disquieting. Murdoch's initial interest in "unselfing" has to do with her wish to complement the action-oriented moral perspective with an account of "the subject qua receptive, and hence with the ethical life as it continues in privacy or in solitude". But she is led further: "something of Weil's ascetic extremism comes through in the closing pages of [The Sovereignty of Good]: what virtue ultimately requires of us is a willingness to reduce ourselves to zero" (p. 31).

What is disquieting for Lovibond here is above all Weil's lack of interest in the outer, judicial, social, structural aspects of moral life. The only real and serious issues are internal ones: we must attend to ourselves to change ourselves and all other aspects of morality lack depth and seriousness beside the enormity of this task. However admirable we find the selfless person in a moral respect, she is far from an unproblematic ideal in a world of social inequalities and an uneven distribution of power (that is, any world we know of). She will not, and indeed, cannot stand up for her rights. Her voice is one of self-denigration, she is here to serve humanity, not to live among equals.

Lovibond measures Murdoch's take on the political aspects of ethics from what could be described as a progressive, loosely post-structuralist, feminist point of view, asking and answering (though not necessarily in these words) questions like: Can Murdoch take the perspective of the culturally disadvantaged? Is she against social change? Is she open for a structural understanding of power relations? Is she in her way part of the problematic liberal individualization of moral responsibility (pushing the moral responsibility of structural problems over to the individual)? Lovibond is inclined to answer all these questions to Murdoch's disadvantage, but there are no simple exegetical paths on this matter, and her argumentation here does not quite add up to the charges she presents. Murdoch's dismissal of structuralism, discussed as evidence for a conservative posture by Lovibond, does not imply that she would necessarily have rejected a broadly post-structuralist criticism of power structures as it is circulated in today's academia through the feminist, Marxist and post-colonial discussions. She did reject women's studies and black studies as rubbish (p. 4), but maybe that was a response to specific texts or thinkers that she had in mind, rather than a rejection of the emancipatory aims. And so on.

Overall, this discussion -- no matter how one is inclined to settle it -- is useful when approaching the small boom of moral inwardness which is discernible in moral philosophy after Murdoch, Wittgenstein, Levinas etc., as it pin-points the call for both inner and outer, individual and collective, virtue and right in ethics.

Murdoch's novels

When Lovibond proceeds to discuss Murdoch's novels, it seems to be on the assumption that they are continuous with her moral philosophy and constitute a platform where she presents her ideas in the narrative mode. This assumption seems plausible enough, especially since her novels have frequently been read as part of her moral philosophical endeavour, and it is vital for Lovibond's perhaps most radical and speculative charge: that an idea of male dominance is inscribed into her platonic conception of morality. She connects Murdoch's idea of morality as vertical -- as an upward journey towards an idea of the good -- to a vertical conception of society where the upmost position is symbolically occupied by the thinking, independent male while the lower position is reserved for the attentive female, gazing upwards for guidance and gratification. This claim on Lovibond's part could not be substantiated without extensive references to interpretations of Murdoch's novels.

Yet, I think one should approach the idea of continuity between philosophy and literature in Murdoch's work with great caution. Murdoch herself is very careful to underline the distinction between literature and philosophy:

Philosophy aims to clarify and to explain, it states and tries to solve very difficult, highly technical problems and the writing must be subservient to this aim. . . . Literature interests us on different levels in different fashions. It is full of tricks and magic and deliberate mystification.[1]

She also evokes the image of literature as a mirror of nature. Its task is to show us the face of reality in its variety; it does not aim to state or settle or explain.[2]

Heeding this, one may suggest that her novels describe what is, rather than what should be. If the author lives in a male chauvinist present then that is what she, from her particular, limited point of view, will describe. This is, I believe, Murdoch's special brand of realism. In her moral philosophy, again, she puts herself into the magnetic field of the platonic ascent, describing our moral lives as a journey towards perfection, that ultimately unattainable and yet all important goal.

Counting submissive women and authoritative men in her novels, as Lovibond does, thus cannot serve as an interpretive guide to her philosophical or political views.

But Lovibond's claim is not only or primarily that Murdoch's novels are part of her philosophical project, expressing her philosophical views in another medium, but rather that there is a common worldview behind her work as a whole, which, regardless of her intentions, reproduces an imagery of male dominance and female submission. This is an accusation which is much more difficult to refute by reference to differences between Murdoch's philosophical and artistic projects. But to make it convincing would require more work on Lovibond's part, since there are many other plausible explanations to the overt male dominance in her novels, most notably and obviously that Murdoch describes what she sees rather that what she wants to see.

These things said, it is clear that Lovibond is not hallucinating when she perceives Murdoch's relation to feminism as awkward. Realism, indeed, is not one thing. Describing human social reality "just as it is" has at any point in recent history produced a great variety of pictures of the world. Murdoch, if anyone, was aware of the ways our idiosyncrasies and experiences form the world we perceive, and emphasized that perception itself is not ideologically, morally or politically innocent, but this does not free her from posthumous scrutiny along these lines.

It may be helpful to compare Murdoch to her nearly exact contemporary Doris Lessing. Both were born in 1919 into (more or less) the British middle class, were deeply affected by their father's experiences in the trenches of the First World War, experienced a Marxist period in their youth and came to renounce the ideology in early middle age, made their literary debuts in their thirties, and were widely read and highly acclaimed throughout their careers.

Looking only at Lessing's realist work one is likely to find deeply sympathetic portrayals of women, struggling with social inequalities, but also, and essentially, with intellectual and existential problems: writer's block, politics, madness, evil. For her the inferior social standing of women seems to be no obstacle for imagining woman as an unquestionable, uncompromised centre of reflective intelligence. If these things are found to have been problematic or uninteresting for Murdoch, we cannot simply explain that by reference to her generational experience and surrounding reality. Something more needs to be said and this something, as Lovibond correctly perceives, is not necessarily flattering.

[1] Murdoch, Iris (1997), Existentialists and Mystics: Writings in Philosophy and Literature, Chatto & Windus, London. p. 4.

[2] Many thanks to Niklas Forsberg for conversations on this issue.