Iris Murdoch, Philosopher: A Collection of Essays

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Justin Broackes (ed.), Iris Murdoch, Philosopher: A Collection of Essays, Oxford University Press, 2012, 385pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199289905.

Reviewed by Megan J. Laverty, Teachers College, Columbia University


This collection is a milestone in the history of Murdoch scholarship. It seeks to establish "that Murdoch is of importance and interest to the same people as read the moral philosophy of Kant and Plato or Philippa Foot and John McDowell" (p. v).[1] The volume stems from a conference (held in 2001) that brought together celebrated Murdoch scholars -- including Maria Antonacio, Carla Bagnoli, A. E Denham, Lawrence Blum, Peter J. Conradi, Margaret Holland and Martha C. Nussbaum -- and relative newcomers -- including Justin Broackes (the volume's editor and the conference's organizer), Bridget Clarke, Roger Crisp, Julia Driver and Richard Moran.[2] The contributors' major publications on Murdoch are listed at the end of this review. Iris Murdoch, Philosopher comprises eleven original essays, an edited extract from Murdoch's unpublished manuscript on Martin Heidegger's philosophy, a personal vignette by John Bayley and a comprehensive introduction by Broackes.

The extract from Murdoch's abandoned book-length manuscript on Heidegger is invaluable for Murdoch scholars. Until now the manuscript had been available only at the Murdoch archives at Kingston University, London. Murdoch is a lucid expositor of Heidegger's ideas. In so doing she develops themes integral to her own philosophy including the character of perception, truth as an achievement and the relationship of philosophy and literature. The extract serves as the perfect companion piece to Murdoch's other writings on Continental thinkers, including Jean-Paul Sartre (Sartre, Romantic Rationalist) and Jacques Derrida (Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, Chapter 7).

Broackes' introduction is so thorough that it threatens to overshadow the essays it is meant to support. It offers a meticulously researched and detailed historical overview of Murdoch's philosophical career that positions her arguments in relation to the philosophical debates of postwar Britain. Broackes usefully distills Murdoch's ten "largest ideas for academic moral philosophy" (p. 8). Many of the ideas will be familiar to readers of Murdoch, including her anti-scientism (2), anti-reductionism about value (9), and anti-Humean psychology (3). Together, these provide the basis for a form of moral realism (1) that emphasizes moral perception, the reliance of moral perception on moral concepts, and the inevitability of moral disagreement (6). More surprising is Broackes' identification of G. W. F. Hegel as the source of Murdoch's realism (10) which is usually tied to the philosophers that she explicitly draws upon, most notably Plato and Simone Weil.[3] Yet, Broackes provides detailed textual support for Murdoch's study of idealism, esteem for Hegel and recognition of Søren Kierkegaard's Fear and Trembling (1843) as one of only three philosophical texts to have greatly influenced her (p. 17, fn. 42). Broackes completes the introduction with a finely calibrated treatment of Murdoch's scholarly output from her earliest papers of the 1950s to The Sovereignty of Good (1970). He acknowledges the importance of her Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals although he admits that its argument still proves elusive. Broackes is preparing a commentary on The Sovereignty of Good which is much anticipated.

Rather than address each essay in turn, I have organized my discussion methodologically and thematically. The methodological continuities include interpreting Murdoch's philosophical and literary works, using limit cases to test and defend her moral philosophy, and adopting a sympathetic but critical approach to her work. The thematic continuities include a concern about the social relevance of Murdoch's moral psychology and the philosophical status of her arguments.

Conradi and Nussbaum are less interested in the relationship of Murdoch's philosophical and literary works than in reading one in light of the other. Conradi explores the theme of discipleship in Under the Net (1954) and The Flight from the Enchanter (1956) and Nussbaum considers the ethical status of sexual love in The Black Prince (1973).[4] Crisp and Denham use limit cases to test and defend Murdoch's moral philosophy. Crisp argues that Murdoch comes closer than either of three main ethical traditions -- Utilitarianism, Kantianism and Aristotelian Virtue Ethics -- to providing an account of the moral value of noble self-sacrifice. Denham uses psychopathology to defend Murdoch's theory of moral motivation on the grounds that it establishes that psychopaths fail to fully grasp moral requirements. Affect, belief and motivation are "all necessary conditions of competence in moral reasoning" (p. 351).

Moran and Blum are the most critical contributors. In Moran's view, the fact that Murdoch's treatment of existentialism is essentially a caricature has inhibited the deeper reception of what is most significant in her own work. He argues that we reach a better appreciation of what is most distinctive about Murdoch's ideas if we consider how they transform existential philosophy. Moran's contribution explains his deep frustration with Murdoch's philosophy, whereas Blum's reflects the maturation of his thinking about Murdoch over the years. Through a close and nuanced reading of passages from Murdoch's philosophical and literary texts, Blum identifies a weakness in Murdoch's eagerness to construe consciousness as activity. This, he shows, leads her to neglect the social, cultural and historical forces that determine and distort vision (the subjective structures of value). Blum argues that if Murdoch had acknowledged these forces, she might have realized that the correction of vision is a necessary but not sufficient condition for right action. Our more entrenched socially and culturally generated stereotypes are not so amenable to change. Thus, according to Blum, moral agency must include vision, but also extend to deliberation, engagement and our manner of response. Blum argues that his criticisms of Murdoch are in keeping with the spirit of her philosophy because he takes seriously her recommendation that moral philosophers should identify ways for individuals to overcome obstacles to moral improvement.

Clarke and Holland share Blum's concern for the social relevance of Murdoch's moral psychology. Clarke defends Murdoch by drawing upon the work of feminist epistemologist, Marilyn Frye, to demonstrate that socially-sensitive pattern perception is implicit in Murdoch's idea of attention. This allows Clarke to conclude that attention requires the perception of individuals within a larger social context. Holland defends Murdoch's conception of freedom as necessity by examining convention and neurosis, the chief obstacles to moral awareness. She argues that individuals must engage in the difficult work of examining and correcting their prejudices and preoccupations if they are to fully recognize the variety and reality of others.

While the essays by Blum, Clarke and Holland address the social relevance of Murdoch's moral psychology, Driver, Antonaccio and Bagnoli consider the question of whether to classify Murdoch's philosophy as particularist (and if so what variety?), metaphysical realist, existentialist, Hegelian or Platonist. Driver identifies three types of particularism -- substantive, epistemological and methodological -- based on their specific objection to principle-based moral systems. She classifies Murdoch as a methodological particularist on the grounds that Murdoch objects to principle-based moral systems because they distort moral experience and deter individuals from inquirying into the specific details of the case. Continuous with her earlier scholarship, Antonaccio argues that Murdoch's philosophy utilizes a religious metaphysical framework to represent the claim of morality on human life -- that we are valuing creatures -- while doing justice to the uniqueness and variety of individuals.

In the most exciting development, Bagnoli, like Broackes, identifies Hegel (along with analytic philosophy) as the most likely source of Murdoch's philosophical commitments (p 221). Bagnoli cites "the recovery of moral life to philosophical investigation" (p. 225), Murdoch's view of moral concepts as concrete universals (p. 222, fn. 67) and her focus on the historical dimension of agency as "Hegelian themes" (p. 225). Like Blum, Bagnoli suggests that Murdoch might have taken a greater interest in the impact "the detail and the history of social institutions" has on agency. Bagnoli thinks that the relationship between personal and community life is a Hegelian insight not fully exploited by Murdoch (p. 225). Both Bagnoli and Broackes represent Murdoch as a non-standard realist. Broackes explains that the "idea of moral reality turns out to be no weirder than that of a world of people and things with refreshing simplicity, spontaneity and other such qualities" (p. 35). Moral reality is nonetheless transcendent, according to Murdoch, because it has an endless complexity that exceeds what we can know of it. Accurate perception is an achievement, and the concepts we use to grasp reality have endless depth. Bagnoli also claims that Murdoch focuses upon the concrete variety of our moral experience and that she views ordinary language as a means of articulating and interrogating moral phenomenology. Bagnoli writes that while "There is nothing outside the picture we make of reality that makes the picture normative," humans are not the privileged source of normativity (p. 213). Instead, reality "is made normative through the operations of our mind, the constructive work of imagination, and the patient and humble exercise of attention" (p. 210). In other words, we improve morally through the creative application of language to restore and redefine our concepts.

My only criticism of this fine collection is Broackes' account of Murdoch's legacy. He writes that it was left to McDowell "to reinvent or develop Murdoch's position, for that view to have any very definite impact on later philosophers" (p. 8). Broackes rightly notes McDowell's development of Murdoch's ideas, but he overlooks Cora Diamond's significant contribution to the abiding influence of Murdoch's philosophy.[5] Diamond is a scholar of Murdoch's philosophy who, like Murdoch, calls for a reorientation of Anglo-American analytic moral philosophy, offers an understanding of reality as brought into view by moral reflection, and appreciates how literature educates moral understanding.[6] A further consequence of Broackes' decision not to present an overview of the early scholarship on Murdoch is the omission of any discussion of the role that feminist philosophy played in upholding many of her ideas, including rereading the Western philosophical tradition, contrasting an ethic of care with an ethics of justice, and consideration of the emotions.

I am delighted by the increasingly sophisticated secondary literature on Murdoch's philosophy represented by Broackes' collection, but while reading it I found myself nostalgic for the intimacy of Murdoch's unmediated address. I am referring here to the experience of reading, for the first time and without preconception, the opening sentences of The Sovereignty of the Good:

It is sometimes said, either irritably or with a certain satisfaction, that philosophy makes no progress. It is certainly true, and I think this is an abiding and not regrettable characteristic of the discipline, that philosophy has in a sense to keep trying to return to the beginning: a thing which is not all that easy to do.[7]

As our understanding of Murdoch's philosophy becomes more sophisticated and nuanced, we should learn from Murdoch's example and strive to remain open to the naïve beginnings of complex philosophical ideas and arguments.


Antonacio, Maria, A Philosophy to Live By: Engaging Iris Murdoch (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012).

Antonacio, Maria, Picturing the Human: The Moral Thought of Iris Murdoch (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000).

Antonaccio, Maria and William Schweiker (eds.), Iris Murdoch and the Search for Human

Goodness (Chicago & London: Chicago University Press, 1996).

Bagnoli, Carla, "Respect and Loving Attention," Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 33 (2003),


Blum, Lawrence, Moral Perception and Particularity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).

Conradi, Peter J., Iris Murdoch: a Life (London: HarperCollins, 2001; New York: W.W. Norton, 2001).

Conradi, Peter J., The Saint and the Artist: a Study of the Fiction of Iris Murdoch (3rd edition.

London: HarperCollins, 2001).

Conradi, Peter J., Iris Murdoch: the Saint and the Artist (2nd edition. London: Macmillan, 1986, 1989).

Denham, A.E. "Envisioning the Good: Iris Murdoch's Moral Psychology," MFS Modern Fiction Studies 47 (2001), 602-29.

Holland, Margaret, "Touching the Weights: Moral Perception and Attention," International

Philosophical Quarterly, 38.3, Issue 151 (1998), 299-312.

Nussbaum, Martha C., "When She was Good," Review of Peter J. Conradi, Iris Murdoch: A LifeThe New Republic 225 issue 27/29 (31 December, 2001), 28-34.

Nussbaum, Martha C., "Love and Vision: Iris Murdoch on Eros and the Individual," in Iris

Murdoch and the Search for Human Goodness, Maria Antonaccio and William

Schweiker (eds.) (Chicago & London: Chicago University Press, 1996), 29-53.

Nussbaum, Martha C., Review of The Fire and the Sun: Why Plato Banished the Artists,

Philosophy and Literature 2 (1978), 125-6.

[1] Overall the book has excellent production values, although footnote ten appears to be missing from Richard Moran's essay.

[2] The Conference was hosted by the Philosophy Department, Brown University. For details, see Iris Murdoch, Philosopher: A Collection of Essays, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012), Preface, v-vi.

[3] For discussion of Plato as the source of Murdoch's realism see the recent work of David Robjant, including: "The Earthy Realism of Plato's Metaphysics, or: What Shall We Do With Iris Murdoch?," Philosophical Investigations, 35. 1 (2012), 43-67; and, "As a Buddhist Christian; the Misappropriation of Iris Murdoch," The Heythrop Journal 70 (2011), 993-1008.

[4] In Iris Murdoch, Gender and Philosophy (New York and London: Routledge, 2012), Sabina Lovibond complicates the arguments of Conradi and Nussbaum by exploring the gendered nature of discipleship in Murdoch's thought.

[5] See Cora Diamond, Ethics: Shifting Perspectives (Harvard: Harvard University Press, forthcoming); "Murdoch the Explorer," Philosophical Topics 38. 1 (2011) 51-85; "'We are Perpetually Moralists': Iris Murdoch, Fact, and Value,' Iris Murdoch and the Search for Human Goodness, 79-109; The Realistic Spirit: Wittgenstein, Philosophy and Mind(Cambridge, MASS: MIT Press, 1991), Chapters 11, 12 and 15; and "Murdoch off the Map, or Taking Empiricism back from the Empiricists," Unpublished Manuscript.

[6] For an elucidation of these ideas, see Alice Crary, "A Brilliant Perspective: Diamondian Ethics," Philosophical Investigations 34. 4. (2001), 331-352.

[7] Iris Murdoch, The Sovereignty of Good (London and New York: Routledge, 1970), 1.