Irony in the Age of Empire: Comic Perspectives on Democracy and Freedom

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Cynthia Willett, Irony in the Age of Empire: Comic Perspectives on Democracy and Freedom, Indiana University Press, 2008, 171pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253219947.

Reviewed by Bernard G. Prusak, Villanova University


The principal thesis of Cynthia Willett's Irony in the Age of Empire is expressed in a question that she puts toward the end of the book: "[W]here better than in comedy do we find that mix of wisdom and irreverence that sustains democracies?" (145). Willett's answer to this quasi-rhetorical question -- one of many throughout the book -- is, as the question suggests, "nowhere better." According to Willett, what she calls "progressive comedy" is critical to the proper functioning of liberal democracies. Moreover, philosophical reflection on the various genres of comedy has the potential to discover a "larger social vision of freedom" than those that normally frame "our standard moral and political debates" (4). In other words, comedy offers "not only … counter-tactics against oppression," but "also … insights into the very meaning of freedom," insights that may "augment and even alter our standard philosophical conceptions of freedom" (117).

Irony in the Age of Empire consists of a relatively long prologue plus five chapters of some twenty pages each. The prologue, entitled "On Truthiness" (a term taken from the satirist Stephen Colbert), sets the political context for Willett's reflections. This context, to which the "age of empire" in the book's title refers, is the post-9/11 presidency of George W. Bush dominated by "the radical agenda of the neoconservatives," against which Willett inveighs (3). Unfortunately, her political statements tend toward leftist boilerplate -- for example, "U.S. foreign policy aims first and foremost for a world 'safe … for the American economic system'" -- for which she typically offers no argumentation, as if none were needed (19). Also unfortunately, such statements and sentiments reduce her book's usefulness for the classroom and distract from its philosophical interest. In any event, Bush and the neoconservatives figure in the book as the foil against which Willett develops the importance and power of comedy. In her words, "Comedy is especially relevant now as a progressive political force. Since the 1980s, the language of freedom in the United States has been laden with a radically conservative political agenda and a strident moral tone" (4-5). So, "Enter the late-night satirists" (she prefers Colbert and Jon Stewart), whose "insurgent comic spirit" not only serves as a means of resistance against "[t]he romance of America as the moral center of a new world order" (27), but enables philosophers to re-think freedom "as subversion and re-engagement -- the key elements for a democratic political ethics" (9).

Each chapter is basically self-standing, and together the chapters form a somewhat disparate collection. Truth to tell, it is difficult to imagine a reader with interest in and acquaintance with all of Willett's "study objects." Chapter 1, "Laugher against Hubris: A Preemptive Strike," consists of discussions of American imperialism, Martha Nussbaum on the tragic, Isaiah Berlin on freedom (already previewed in the prologue), and then Toni Morrison. Chapter 2, "Laughing to Keep from Crying: Cornel West, Pragmatism, and Progressive Comedy," is all about West and his visionary, prophetic pragmatism. Chapter 3, "Authenticity in an Age of Satire: Ellison, Sartre, Bergson, and Spike Lee's Bamboozled," is mostly about the Spike Lee film; the discussion of Bergson is surprisingly brief and disappointing. Chapter 4, "Engage the Enemy: Cavell, Comedies of Remarriage, and the Politics of Friendship," focuses on Cavell and George Cukor's 1940 film The Philadelphia Story. Chapter 5, "Three Concepts of Freedom," returns yet again to Berlin. This chapter is the most philosophically substantive and intriguing in the book, though some of it feels repetitive after the discussions of Berlin in the prologue and in chapter 1.

Since Willett discusses Berlin at several places in her book, it makes sense to focus this review on what she has to say about his thinking. Willett speaks of Berlin's essay "Two Concepts of Liberty" as "both a foil and a launching pad" for her own reflections (118). Her aim, she states at one point, is "to replace the cold-war era, tragic discourse on freedom (exemplified by Berlin) with a post cold-war, anti-imperialist vision of freedom as solidarity (as glimpsed in various modes of progressive comedy)." Note, then, that her interest is not comedy as such, which she does not attempt to define, but "progressive comedy" -- comedy that works toward what she calls, in the paragraph following this quotation, "a libidinal politics of freedom" (14).

(By the way, somewhat comically, Willett uses the words 'libido,' 'libidinal,' and 'libidinally' again and again and again, with such insistency that the reader can begin to suspect a verbal tic. A vestigial Freudianism courses through the book, though Willett nowhere discusses Freud's own theories of "Witz" and humor.) It is to her credit that Willett acknowledges, more than once, that comedy can just as easily exclude and oppress as it can liberate. It may be a demerit of her book, however, that she never steps back from her politics to ask what we should think of a form of art (if comedy is rightly classified as art) that may be turned to such different ends. In this regard, Bergson's Le rire, for all its deficiencies, is perhaps more advanced.

Willett is critical of Berlin's "valorization" of negative freedom over and against positive freedom, or negative rights against interference over and against positive rights to goods and services and so to a basic democratic equality. Whereas Berlin, thinking during the Cold War and fearful of tragedy, believed that "the positive doctrine of freedom … threatens liberalism with authoritarianism" (121), Willett, thinking after the Cold War and hopeful in the power of progressive comedy, believes that "[n]egative freedom without social equality is domination, and either or both without solidarity fails [sic] to generate the networks of care that sustain social harmony" (124). According to her, we need to keep in mind and in play three concepts of freedom (hence the title of chapter 5): not only negative freedom "against" and positive freedom "to," but a "freedom of belonging to cooperative communities," a third concept or "dimension" of freedom that she draws out of some remarks at the end of Berlin's essay (124-125; see also 34-35).

Willett's hope in the power of progressive comedy is founded on her claim that the various genres of comedy -- farce, camp, and the carnivalesque; satire and the comedy of manners; and romantic comedy and comedies of friendship -- all can be deployed to support these three freedoms (though some forms of comedy, like blackface, obviously work the other way). Putting all forms of "politically regressive" comedy out of mind, Willett writes that "the genres of farce, camp, and the carnivalesque redirect liberalism's negative freedom away from the valorization of individual choice and toward the destabilization of norms and disciplinary practices that block choice to begin with" (129). In other words, these genres of comedy can give us a deeper appreciation of what is really needed for negative freedom, not so much from the state as from society, which is a genuine insight. Satire of character and the comedy of manners, by ridiculing arrogance and cognate social vices, inculcate a spirit of democratic egalitarianism. Finally, "romantic comedy and comedies of friendship shift the main focus of social freedom away from codes of honor and toward the more convivial bonds of affiliation" (130). Which all may be true -- it seems right that the different genres of comedy can do all that Willett claims -- but what political program is supposed to take its lead from these points? In other words, after we have had our liberating laughter, what are we -- in words from an earlier political era -- to do now?

In the chapter on Cornel West, Willett comments that

the expectation for the moral leadership, the epic vision, of a Martin Luther King or a Malcolm X [two rather different leaders!] may be doomed to meet with disappointment. The post-soul generation of urban life may call for a different kind of leader with a different kind of bravado. One wonders: could it be the bravado of the urban comic wit? (52)

But then one thinks: probably not. For would a comedian really make a good leader? Not, in any event, qua comedian. Willett's book also leaves one thinking about the risks of trying to do "philosophy of the present." One risk is that, by the time one's work is published, the times may have changed, and the Zeitgeist been transmuted. After two election cycles in which U.S. neoconservatives have gone down to defeat, and after the election and inauguration of Barack Obama as president, the frame for Willett's reflections on the comic seems outdated. Arguably, now that progressives have come into power, comedy may also have less of a role to play in progressive politics. As Jay Leno joked on his show shortly after Obama's inauguration, "Nice to have you all here. As you all know, George Bush is no longer president, so there'll be no monologue" (quoted in the New York Times, "Laugh Lines," Week-in-Review, 1/25/09).

To reiterate, Willett's book does offer insights. Another is that, "[i]n comedy the unfree character is not the one who refuses to give her life a coherent rational plan," but "the one who suffers from social vices such as vanity, arrogance, or self-deception" (7). Willett offers this observation as a supplement to the "standard liberal view of freedom" as rational autonomy. Her observation does supplement this understanding of freedom -- though appreciation of her observation is accompanied by a nagging suspicion that she has caricatured liberal thought. One might also feel that Willett has not quite gotten to the bottom of the importance of the "comic spirit." Consider in this regard a typically cryptic but suggestive remark of Wittgenstein's in Culture and Value:

Humor is not a mood but a way of looking at the world. So if it is correct to say that humor was stamped out in Nazi Germany, that does not mean that people were not in good spirits, or anything of that sort, but something much deeper and more important.

It seems that philosophy has not yet answered what that "something much deeper and more important" is.