Virtues of Freedom: Selected Essays on Kant

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Paul Guyer, Virtues of Freedom: Selected Essays on Kant, Oxford University Press, 2017, 314 pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780198755654.

Reviewed by Anne Margaret Baxley, Washington University in St. Louis


This book comprises sixteen essays on Kant's ethics by Paul Guyer. Three are previously unpublished; two of the previously published essays were originally published in German and appear here in English for the first time; a number of the previously published essays have been expanded and revised. The volume is helpfully organized into three parts, concerning, respectively, Kant's views concerning the value of freedom, the actualization of freedom, and the realization of freedom. Although each plays an integral role in Guyer's sustained treatment of the specific notion of freedom at the heart of Kant's ethics, the three divisions could fruitfully be read as independent monographs, each covering a core aspect of Kant's mature account of freedom of choice and its significance in a rational, moral life.

This is a masterful achievement by one of the world's foremost Kant scholars. It represents a welcome and original contribution to Kant's ethics. It will be mandatory reading for anyone interested in Kant's conception of freedom and his lifelong attempts to identify and justify the particular form of freedom that he takes to be required if morality is possible for us. Guyer makes a compelling case that freedom understood in the quintessentially modern sense of freedom of choice, or the freedom to set our own ends, is fundamental to Kant's moral theory. He demonstrates how this notion of freedom underlies the central concepts of Kantian morality, including the categorical imperative and its main formulations, the concept of humanity as an end in itself, autonomy, the highest good, virtue, and Kant's various categories of duty. Guyer succeeds in saying something new about a familiar theme in the way he untangles the novel aspects of Kant's account of the nature and value of moral freedom, and meticulously reconstructs Kant's various attempts to justify the claim that finite rational agents possess the freedom to act on the basis of categorical moral commands. In addition, several of the essays contain illuminating discussions of Kant's views on happiness and its connection to virtue and freedom, as well as a promising Kantian account of empirically acquired moral character.

It would be impossible to do justice to the wide range of important topics and interpretive issues that Guyer deftly explores in his latest volume on Kant. Accordingly, the remainder of this review will focus on two central themes that should be of broad interest to contemporary readers of Kant before concluding with a brief synopsis of chapters.

The guiding theme throughout this book is that autonomy is fundamental to Kant's moral theory. Of course, this claim might initially strike readers as obvious, for it is widely known that, at least from the time of the publication of the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals in 1785, Kant explicitly treats autonomy as foundational for his moral theory. Moreover, it is generally thought that Kant's ideal of moral autonomy represents his distinctively modern contribution to the history of ethics. Guyer's interesting and novel twist on this familiar theme lies in bringing out what is genuinely original about Kant's account of moral freedom. As Guyer explains, we can find in Kant's works a familiar and well known ancient conception of freedom as freedom from domination from one's own desires and the impulses of others, or freedom from the fear of disappointment that comes with taking the satisfaction of desires to be the source of happiness (what Guyer labels "negative freedom") (7, 9). The value of negative freedom lies in the tranquility borne out of freedom from domination by our desires. Freedom, so understood, appears to be nothing essentially different from the Hellenistic idea (common to Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Cynicism) that we should free ourselves from as many desires as possible in order to minimize the number of desires that are likely to be frustrated and to maximize the number of desires that can readily be satisfied. Guyer does not deny that Kant recognizes the value of freedom in this negative sense, for Kant clearly thinks that freedom from wanting too much or from wanting things that are hard to attain is instrumentally valuable in promoting the agent's own happiness. Yet, Guyer's central claim is that what is unique about Kant's account of autonomy is an alternative "positive" account of freedom that Kant develops beginning in approximately 1784, at the time when he was working on the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. Positive freedom as Kant conceives of it is our capacity freely to set our own ends, or our freedom of choice.

On Guyer's reading, our freedom to set our own ends is, in Kant's ethics, the only thing intrinsically and unconditionally valuable (7, 12). Freedom in this positive sense is valuable for its own sake and universally, for every human being (10). Freedom of choice is the source of the absolute value human beings are understood to possess, and is the basis of the respect that we owe to ourselves and to others. Guyer argues that Kant's positive account of freedom as the freedom to set one's own ends marks an advance over the ancient conception of freedom from desires (negative freedom), and represents Kant's distinctively modern account of freedom secured through reason (11, 15).

Guyer's central thesis that freedom of choice is the fundamental value promoted by morality provides a powerful lens for viewing Kant's ethics. Depending on one's perspective, this interpretive principle has the power to bring into focus previously neglected aspects of Kant's moral theory, or to transform the overall shape of Kant's ethics. I will mention three notable claims that Guyer advances on the basis of his general thesis concerning the absolute value of our capacity freely to set our own ends, all three of which are bound to generate constructive critical discussion of how best to understand Kant's considered commitments.

In the first place, Guyer claims that we can understand Kant's moral theory as a species of moral perfectionism. Although Kant rejects certain forms of perfectionism, especially the traditional version of it held by his rationalist predecessor Wolff, Guyer claims that Kant does not reject the view that perfection is the goal of morality. As he interprets Kant, Kant holds that the end of morality is precisely to perfect ourselves, by perfecting our quality of will, or our power of choice (79). Kantian perfectionism entails striving to exercise our capacity for free choice in a way that is consistent with itself and with the exercise of that same capacity by others, which is to say, in a way that satisfies the rational constraint of universalizability (81).

In the second place, Guyer explains that freedom is foundational for Kant's moral theory in that it is the very source of our moral obligations. In other words, Kant's central concept of duty can be understood in terms of preserving and promoting intra- and inter-personal freedom -- to abide by duty and to conform one's actions to the moral law is to act in ways that protect and promote freedom of choice. With respect to perfect duties, in abiding by them, we preserve the possibility of further choices for ourselves and for others affected by them. With respect to imperfect duties, in acting in ways to fulfill them, we promote our freedom of choice or that of others, by expanding rather than contracting the range of possible ends that can be set (or willed).

In the third place, Guyer explains that freedom as the capacity to set our own ends brings with it its own kind of satisfaction. Although the pursuit of self-chosen ends will inevitably expose us to the frustration of failing to realize at least some of them, the satisfaction we find in having freely chosen our own ends will ultimately outweigh such frustration (47-8). Several of the essays contain thoughtful discussions about the relationship between positive freedom, satisfaction, and happiness. As I read Guyer, he thinks that Kant recognizes a particular feeling of satisfaction we feel in exercising our freedom of choice (positive freedom) that is distinct from both the satisfaction of inclination (empirical happiness) as well as the tranquility that results from avoiding difficult-to-satisfy desires and confining ourselves to readily satisfied ones (the value of negative freedom). Guyer's account of the special sense of satisfaction we find in exercising and realizing our freedom of choice strikes me as an important and overlooked aspect of what might ultimately be a broader Kantian conception of happiness or, perhaps better, well-being. Readers interested in understanding Kant's views on happiness and its relation to what Kant tends to characterize as a form of moral self-contentment or rational satisfaction that follows from the recognition of one's virtue will benefit from paying special attention to Guyer's account of the contentment we experience in exercising and realizing our freedom to set our own ends.[1]

A second major theme is that Kant can be understood as holding a view Guyer labels "normative essentialism." On Guyer's analysis, Kant was attracted to normative essentialism both prior to and after the development of his famous doctrine of transcendental idealism. When Guyer introduces the notion of normative essentialism, he initially defines it as follows:

This is the position, whether it can be understood empirically, as Kant did in the late 1760s, or can only be understood through the metaphysics of transcendental idealism, as he did after 1770, that human beings are capable of setting their own ends and to treat them otherwise is as it were to deny the most obvious truths about them, the impermissibility of which needs no explanation other than logic alone (viii).

Guyer's suggestion that we can read Kant as a normative essentialist merits careful consideration, but I was unclear about exactly how we should understand the view. At times, Guyer seems to understand normative essentialism as a position in normative ethics, or to represent a normative claim or principle concerning how we ought to treat all rational agents (ourselves and others). Here, the idea is that we ought always to treat rational beings as if they were free in all of their actions; failing to do so amounts to contradicting the essential concept of what it is to be a human being and is morally objectionable for that metaphysical reason (49; cf. viii). In other words, Kant presumes that freedom belongs to us as part of our very essence, and because of this metaphysical fact, to be treated in a way that minimizes or undermines one's freedom is to be treated in a way that contradicts one's true essence as a rational being (144). More specifically, Guyer sees the contradiction tied up with violating this normative principle as a logical contradiction, for it amounts to treating a being that has free agency and a will as if she does not.

At other times, Guyer characterizes normative essentialism slightly differently, as if it is best understood as a position in metaethics more generally. Understood as a metaethical approach to the question of normativity, normative essentialism attempts to derive the moral "ought" from a description of our rational nature or essence. Although metaethical normative essentialism need not rely on transcendental idealism, it looks as if Guyer thinks that Kant's attempts to employ this strategy in arguing for the validity of the moral law often appeal to transcendental idealism. Guyer claims, for instance, that normative essentialism might have been anticipated by Plato, but that Kant's defense of it on the basis of the distinction between our phenomenal and noumenal selves is decidedly novel (17). Of course, this need not imply that transcendental idealism is always part of normative essentialism, but at times it seems as if Guyer views the doctrine of normative essentialism as more often than not involving attempts to prove the validity of the moral law by appeal to metaphysical claims about our noumenal selves (17; cf. 53, 58, 65).

Finally, there are passages in which Guyer treats normative essentialism most simply as an axiological commitment on Kant's part about what has unconditioned value in his ethics.  For example, Guyer notes that the substance of normative essentialism is "the idea that the freedom of all, humanity in my own person and that of every other, is the inner worth of the world" (65).

It might well be the case that normative essentialism is usefully understood as capturing a Kantian normative ethics, a Kantian account of value, and a Kantian metaethical view about the nature of normativity -- something that would indeed be an interesting result based on Guyer's original interpretation. I take it that, as a metaethical approach, normative essentialism is a form of moral realism, which holds that we can derive normative claims from an account of (facts about) our essence as rational beings. Kant often appeals to transcendental idealism in making such arguments, but he (and Kantians) need not do so. This second broad theme in Guyer's volume should be a rich source of further research for anyone interested in Kantian metaethics, especially because it seems to provide a viable alternative to what now seems to be a dominant constructivist interpretation of Kant's account of value, most prominently advanced by Christine Korsgaard.[2]

All of the essays advance scholarly debates about Kant's philosophy in notable ways. Guyer's analysis reflects a mastery of Kant's corpus and a deep knowledge of the relevant views of Kant's most important predecessors and contemporaries. Guyer is also adept at showing how Kant's systematic concerns about normativity and freedom of choice connect with contemporary debates in ethical theory and metaethics. This book is densely argued and thus is not easy reading, but it is without doubt well worth the investment for anyone interested in Kant's moral theory and his account of the freedom on which morality is based.

Synopsis of Chapters

1. "Kant, Autonomy, and Modernity" explains how Kant's conception of the intrinsic and unconditioned value of freedom differs from the ancient conception of ataraxia (or tranquility), understood as freedom from desires. The primary difference is that Kant treats our freedom to set our own ends as valuable for its own sake, not because it directly promotes our happiness.

2. "Is and Ought: From Hume to Kant, and Now" argues that Kant did not reject all attempts to derive normative principles from descriptive claims, but merely the attempt to derive an "ought" from a description of our moral sentiments. Prior to the "fact of reason" doctrine in the second Critique, Kant himself sought to derive the moral "ought" from a description of our rational nature or essence.

3. "Freedom as the Foundation of Morality: Kant's Early Efforts" explores Kant's transition, around 1764-5, from a purely psychological approach to morality to normative essentialism.

4. "Freedom and the Essential Ends of Humankind" contends that freedom understood as the capacity to set our own ends is the central concept of Kantian morality.

5. "Kantian Perfectionism" investigates Kant's claim, in the lectures on ethics, that his own theory of morality grounded in autonomy is a version of perfectionism, according to which morality directs us to perfect our will, or our freedom of choice.

6. "Setting and Pursuing Ends: Internal and External Freedom" argues that all of Kant's categories of duty can be interpreted as duties to treat humanity as an end in itself, as long as humanity is equated with the capacity to set ends, and duties are construed as conditions for the preservation or promotion of this crucial capacity.

7. "Freedom, Ends, and Duties in Vigilantius" explores the detailed discussions of duties to self and duties to others found in the notes for Kant's course on the metaphysics of morals from 1793-4.

8. "The Proof-Structure of the Groundwork and the Role of Section III" investigates Kant's attempt to prove the validity of the moral law, by proving that we have free will and that the moral law is the only possible law of a free will.

9. "Proving Ourselves Free" argues that Kant's attempts to prove the metaphysical freedom of the will are first-personal (proofs of one's own freedom), while the freedom that we impute to others is compatibilist and known empirically.

10. "Problems with Freedom: Kant's Arguments in Groundwork III and its Subsequent Emendations" shows that Kant's attempt in the Groundwork to prove that the categorical imperative is necessarily binding for all finite rational agents amounts to a metaphysical argument that depends upon a problematic claim about our "noumenal" selves.

11. "Natural and Rational Belief: Kant's Final Words?" concerns Kant's resolution of the problem of responsibility for good and evil in Religion, and argues that his doctrine concerning the possibility of moral conversion at any time undermines his earlier argument about personal immortality in the second Critique.

12. "A Passion for Reason: Hume, Kant, and the Motivation for Morality" argues that the gap between Kant and Hume is not as great as it initially appears. Hume recognizes that we have a calm passion for tranquility, which mimics reason and is the foundation of morality, while Kant recognizes that we can act morally only if, under the direction of reason, we transform our innate passion for our own freedom into a concern for the freedom of all.

13. "The Obligation to be Virtuous: Kant's Conception of Tugendverpflichtung" analyzes Kant's distinction between the ethical duty to be virtuous in general and our particular duties of virtue.

14. "Kant on Moral Feelings: From the Lectures to the Metaphysics of Morals" investigates Kant's evolving views about the necessity of strengthening and cultivating our natural tendencies toward morality.

15. "Examples of Moral Possibility" discusses the role that genuine examples of virtue play in a Kantian account of moral education.

16. "Kantian Communities: The Realm of Ends, the Ethical Community, and the Highest Good" explores the various concepts of moral community found in Kant's ethical writings, and claims that his conception of the highest good evolves from an individualistic to a communalistic ideal.

[1] Kant thinks that virtue is its own reward in that it produces a uniquely moral feeling of self-contentment (Selbstzufriedenheit) concerning one’s own inner worth, or an intellectual contentment of heart achieved through good conduct (VE 27:647; KpV 5:117-118; MS 6:387-388).  Moral contentment of this sort involves “satisfaction with one’s person and one’s own moral conduct, and so with what one does” (MS 6:387-388).  Happiness, by contrast, involves “satisfaction with what nature bestows, and so with what one enjoys as a gift from without” (MS 6:387-388).  In Vigilantius, Kant is recorded as marking the distinction between moral contentment and happiness most succinctly by distinguishing between “contentment with oneself” and “contentment with one’s lot” (VE 27:643).  The interpretive issue that I aim to highlight here concerns how we should understand the relation(s) between happiness (the satisfaction of empirical desire), moral contentment (the rational contentment that follows from the recognition of one’s inner worth) and the satisfaction that follows from exercising and realizing one’s freedom to set ends (what Guyer identifies as the value of freedom in the positive sense).

[2] Most notably in The Source of Normativity, Korsgaard argues that Kant’s claim that humanity is an end in itself is a constructed fact, one grounded in practical commitments that are generated by the very exercise of rational agency.  On Korsgaard’s influential Kantian account, through reflection on the very conditions of rational agency, we come to realize that we must regard ourselves as ends in ourselves, in order to account for the goodness of our choices.  It looks as if Guyer’s normative essentialism provides a promising realist alternative interpretation to Kantian constructivism, insofar as normative essentialism holds that the value of persons is a fact that is rooted directly in an account of our rational nature or essence.