Is Philosophy Androcentric?

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Iddo Landau, Is Philosophy Androcentric?, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2006, 181pp., $45.00 (hbk). ISBN 0271029064.

Reviewed by Sharon Crasnow, Riverside Community College-Norco


Iddo Landau has written a focused and clearly organized book in which he investigates the extent to which Western philosophy is androcentric. He concludes that it "is, in most respects and ways, not androcentric, and that the few ways in which it is androcentric are less consequential than is frequently believed." (p. 3)

Landau distinguishes two ways philosophy might be androcentric. It could be "pervasively androcentric", by which he means "requiring rejection or replacement by feminist alternatives of most of its theses and aspects." Alternatively, it could be "nonpervasively androcentric", that is "allowing most of it to remain unchanged by requiring merely a renunciation of some androcentric themes and, if necessary, a few other connected themes". (pp. 6-7) It is his contention that none of the cases he examines are cases in which philosophy is pervasively androcentric and there are only a few kinds of cases in which it is shown to be nonpervasively androcentric. He concludes by recommending that feminists turn their attentions from scrutinizing Western philosophy for androcentricity. As he puts it, "[t]his may clear space for other concerns, and allow the devotion of much scholarly work to other theoretical and practical ends." (p. 165)

Landau identifies seven varieties of feminist argument for the androcentricity of philosophy. According to his classification, the arguments are based on: 1) explicitly androcentric statements that appear in the work of various philosophers; 2) the association of philosophical notions with stereotypes or social contexts that are androcentric in other, non-philosophical circumstances; 3) the claim that notions employed in philosophical theories have harmed women; 4) the use of androcentric metaphors; 5) the difference between the interests of men and women; 6) cognitive and psychological differences between men and women; and finally 7) a failure to consider issues that are relevant to women (arguments of omission). It is arguments of type 2, 3, 5, and 6 that Landau claims fail to establish that philosophy is androcentric. While arguments of type 1, 4 and 7 do show some philosophies to be androcentric, they are not pervasively androcentric.

There are three serious difficulties with this book. The first has to do with a decision Landau makes about what he will not do in the book. Among the many things that he states that he does not intend to do, Landau notes that he will not discuss other issues in feminist philosophy and that he will only focus on androcentricity. (He also notes that he will not look at Continental philosophy or non-Western philosophies and so one might wonder to what extent the question "Is philosophy androcentric?" is addressed.) Landau is entitled to define the issues as he sees fit; however, I question whether it is fruitful to isolate arguments about the androcentricity of philosophy from the feminist projects in which such arguments occur. The philosophers whose work he explores are not interested in the question of androcentricity in isolation, but rather in the role it plays in impeding progress towards other worthwhile goals, such as social justice, understanding knowledge, and what it is to be an ethical human being. To isolate androcentricity from these contexts may well distort the arguments.

My second concern is that some of Landau's counter-arguments to feminist claims of androcentrism beg the question of what does and does not count as androcentric. This indicates another failure to recognize the way many feminists frame these issues and the role that discussions of androcentricity play in that framing. Finally, I will consider the status of his claim that the search for an alternative feminist philosophy should be abandoned, an issue he investigates in the penultimate chapter of the book.

In order to discuss the first concern, I will consider an example of how Landau inappropriately treats arguments for androcentricity in isolation. He considers Susan Moller Okin's (1992) account of Aristotle's androcentricity in which she looks at the role of Aristotle's explicitly androcentric statements (a type 1 argument). Landau argues that Aristotle's philosophy is not pervasively androcentric, as he believes Okin is claiming. Rather the androcentric elements of Aristotle can be (and should be) excised from Aristotle without rejecting his philosophy as a whole. Landau interprets Okin's argument as one supporting the claim that Aristotle is pervasively androcentric:

Okin points out that Aristotle's androcentric views are related to various general basic assumptions, and rejecting the androcentric views would require rejecting the basic assumptions as well. Rejecting these basic assumptions, however, is no small matter, since it would lead also to the rejection of many nonandrocentric views that are deduced from the assumptions. Okin argues, for example, that 'Aristotle's identification of the hierarchical status quo with the natural, the necessary, and the good cannot withstand the emancipation of women into political life'… . Thus, if women were to be emancipated, this identification, and all that relies on it, would be undermined. (p. 18)

Contra Okin, Landau argues that Aristotle does not always identify the status quo with "the natural, the necessary, and the good" since, for instance, Aristotle claims that the contemplative life is good and such a life was not the status quo. With this and other examples as evidence, Landau argues that the sexual hierarchy that Aristotle assumes, accepts, and supports could be rejected and yet most of the other features of his moral-political philosophy could be retained. Hence Aristotle, while explicitly androcentric in some passages, is not pervasively androcentric.

According to Landau, Okin does not allow for the fact that there is much in Aristotle that we would not want or need to reject (though he does not argue for this). Since Aristotle did not always hold that the status quo was good (natural or necessary) we do not need to think of his claim that the hierarchical status quo is natural, good, or necessary as one of his basic assumptions. We may still be able to derive the "good" parts of Aristotle without this assumption. But Landau fails to acknowledge that though Aristotle did not always hold the status quo as good (necessary or natural) this does not establish that Aristotle did not hold the hierarchical status quo as good (necessary or natural). But it is the hierarchical assumption that Okin is worried about and believes is basic to Aristotle's philosophy.

Still, Landau's central point may hold: the androcentric elements can be disentangled and excised from the rest of Aristotle's philosophy. As Landau notes, many other parts (the "good" elements) of Aristotle's moral-political philosophy follow from basic assumptions that Okin says that we should reject because of their androcentrism. If the basic assumption is that the hierarchical status quo is natural, necessary, and good, and if Aristotle's androcentric claims follow from this assumption, then Okin is right that we ought to reject the hierarchical claim. However, we can reject this basic assumption but find others that will get us to the moral-political consequences that are desirable without androcentrism. So, Landau's worry that Okin is claiming that we have to throw out everything in Aristotle is not justified by his argument.

Landau does not consider why Okin investigates Aristotle's androcentrism to begin with. It is not in order to categorize Aristotle as androcentric, either pervasively or otherwise. Rather, Okin's goal is to identify assumptions that support consequences that are not consistent with feminist goals; it is not to categorize and chastise the philosopher or philosophy, but to understand more fully the connections between ideas that might play a role in creating and maintaining systems of patriarchy. That we are motivated by Okin's work to examine these connections shows that she is successful in achieving her objectives. By focusing only on androcentrism, Landau obscures this aspect of feminist work.

My second concern is with his discussion of arguments of type 2, 3, 5, and 6. I will focus on type 2: arguments from association. In faulting these arguments, many of Landau's counterarguments beg the question. In looking at Genevieve Lloyd's (1993) arguments by association, Landau offers the following characterization:

1. A philosophy presents a preference for a certain nonandrocentric category, without in any way linking it androcentrically with women or men (or feminists, masculinity, and so on), or using it in any androcentric way.

2. Other contexts do androcentrically link the category in question with women or men (or femininity, masculinity, and so on).

3. Conclusion: The philosophy in question involves male discrimination against women, leads to the domination of women by men, and so on; that is, the philosophy in question is androcentric. (p. 33)

Lloyd argues that Descartes' mind-body distinction, while not explicitly androcentric, is nonetheless androcentric when put in the context of Western culture where man is identified with mind (reason) and woman with body. Landau claims that such arguments fail to establish androcentricity of any sort (either pervasive or nonpervasive) for two reasons: they attribute androcentricity by "using a criterion that is too liberal" (p.37) and they could be used to show that Descartes' philosophy is gynocentric. I will look at only the first of these, though there is a similar problem with the second.

According to Landau, if we accept Lloyd's criterion and the arguments that it supports, then we will have to accept that not only reason, but other qualities associated with men would have to be rejected or modified as well. The examples he uses are "initiative, leadership, ability, achievement, courage, creativity, and persistence." (p. 37) But there seems to be a missing premise required to establish that these other qualities are associated with androcentrism in some other context, as Lloyd claims that reason is. In the case of mind and body, reason is identified with the mind in Descartes' work and, though Descartes himself does not use it androcentrically, it is used androcentrically elsewhere. In Lloyd's analysis, there is another element and that is that body, which Descartes holds to be distinct from mind (and hence reason), is identified in the culture with woman. Landau would need to establish not only that initiative, leadership, etc. are associated with men but explain how those characteristics are antithetical to some others associated with women and how such characterizations are used oppressively in other contexts. However, even if that evidence were forthcoming, there would still be a problem. Landau's argument is a reductio, with the conclusion that it would be absurd to reject or modify the notions of initiative, leadership, ability, achievement, courage, creativity, and persistence as androcentric. But it is quite plausible that these categories are androcentric in some contexts and, if so, feminists suggest we should be cautious of and self-conscious about their use. To deny this is to beg the question about what counts as androcentric.

Finally, Landau considers the viability of a feminist alternative to philosophy. Not surprisingly, he finds this search futile and even incoherent. "When one reads feminist philosophers, one encounters by and large the methodologies and basic principles found in nonfeminist philosophy. Feminist philosophers, too, present evidence; point out relevant facts; note their sources; explain; … " and so on. (p. 149) This is hardly surprising. Although there are some claims by feminist philosophers that might be interpreted as seeking an alternative philosophy, for the most part, feminist philosophy has been most successful and constructive when offering alternative understandings of traditional philosophical ideas. So, for instance, in feminist epistemology, Helen Longino (1991, 2001), Sandra Harding (1991, 2004), and Alison Wylie (2004), among others, offer alternative understandings of evidence and objectivity. Their accounts are both feminist and recognizable within the framework of traditional Western philosophy. Such accounts also illustrate the extent to which feminist philosophy has gone beyond the critical project of identifying androcentrism that Landau is so concerned with. Feminist philosophers have already "cleared space" and moved on as Landau urges.

I have been puzzled by a tension between feminist critiques and extensions of Western philosophical traditions and the understandings of feminism that appear in counter-critiques by those, like Landau, who identify themselves as feminist-friendly. Landau finishes with a characterization that has helped me see the issue more clearly. He states that "[f]eminist philosophy can be considered as a truth-seeking enterprise, or as a political endeavor." (p. 165) To treat these as mutually exclusive alternatives, as he does, is to reject the premises on which feminist philosophy is based. The investigation of power relations, the role of the political, social, and cultural in the search for truth and understanding, is one of feminist philosophy's key features, one that it shares with a number of other philosophical traditions, including pragmatism. That it is worth investigating how the political can hinder or aid our understanding of the world and our place in it is a presupposition of feminist philosophy. If we believe that truth-seeking and political goals are mutually exclusive, then it is difficult to grasp the nature of core feminist arguments.


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______________"Rethinking Standpoint Epistemology: What is Strong Objectivity?" The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader. London: Routledge, 2004.

Lloyd, Genevieve. The Man of Reason: "Male" and "Female" in Western Philosophy. 2nd edition, London: Routledge, 1993.

Longino, Helen E. Science As Social Knowledge. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991.

­­­­­­­­­­­­_______________. The Fate of Knowledge. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2001.

Okin, Susan Moller, Justice, Gender and the Family. New York: Basic Books, 1989.

________________, Women in Western Political Thought. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.

Wylie, A. "Why Standpoint Matters," in The Feminist Standpoint Reader, edited by Sandra Harding, New York: Routledge, 339-351, 2004.