Is the Welfare State Justified?

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Daniel Shapiro, Is the Welfare State Justified?, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 323pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521677936.

Reviewed by Matthew Smith, Yale University


Any philosophically sophisticated effort at bringing political theory to bear on urgent policy questions should be welcomed.  And so I hail Daniel Shapiro, whose friendly book Is the Welfare State Justified? considers whether the dominant institutionalized forms of welfare traditionally supported by liberal political philosophers better meet the standards of liberal political theory than do libertarian alternatives.  The liberal programs in question are national health insurance (NHI), social security pensions (SS), and state-sponsored unemployment insurance; their libertarian institutional alternatives are market-based health insurance (MHI), compulsory private pensions (CPP), and private charity, respectively.  For each pair, Shapiro devotes two chapters breathlessly summarizing many arguments and large amounts of data in order to argue that, by the lights of liberal political theory, the libertarian alternatives always either win out against, or, as in the case of private charities, are evenly matched with, traditional welfare programs.  Shapiro's methodology and breadth of research initially impresses, but it is rushed, leaving little room for philosophically sophisticated reflection about the complexity of and interrelations between the personal and social dynamics determining many politically relevant features of our lives.  This limitation is compounded by the fact that Shapiro's empirical data are as often culled from partisan texts produced by libertarian think tanks as they are drawn from disciplinarily central economics journals.  Consequently, with few exceptions, liberals will find the book neither convincing nor particularly illuminating.

Although Shapiro discusses rights-based liberalism and liberal communitarianism, he devotes most of his efforts to showing how egalitarianism supports libertarian alternatives to the welfare state.  On Shapiro's view, the core principle of egalitarianism is that "inequalities or disadvantages that arise through no choice or fault of one's own [i.e., as a result of brute luck] are unfair and should be rectified or at least minimized in some way" (p. 19).  Additionally, egalitarians are supposedly committed to an "antisubsidization principle": people must be held responsible for (and have rights to the benefits of) the consequences of their genuine or uncoerced choices (i.e., the benefits and burdens they bear due to option luck).  Finally, egalitarians are committed to a principle of "epistemic access."  Shapiro never offers a clear definition of this, although he explains its absence.  Epistemic access is what is absent when an institution

blocks or makes it difficult to obtain reasonably accurate or reliable information about the nature or evolution of that institution or program, and … is so complex and complicated that it is unlikely that anyone but experts can monitor its effects or evolution. (p. 33) 

With these egalitarian principles in hand, Shapiro argues that MHI (in the form of compulsory insurance and tax-free medical savings accounts (MSAs)) better lives up to these principles than does NHI (in the form of universal state-sponsored health insurance).

The lynchpin of Shapiro's argument is that people are, as a rule, responsible for most of their health conditions (see pp. 69ff).  Consequently, as a matter of justice, inequalities or disadvantages due to health do not need to be rectified.  Furthermore, it would in fact be unjust, because of the antisubsidization principle, to make others pay the medical costs of those who have 'chosen' poor health.  Since NHI provides insurance to all for all procedures regardless of an individual's choices and is funded by taxes paid by both those who lead healthy lives and those who lead unhealthy lives, it ends up being utterly unresponsive to the first two egalitarian requirements.  MHI, on the other hand, makes people pay for their bad choices (quite literally by making them pay for their own medical care out of their medical savings accounts), and rewards those who make good choices (by allowing them to keep ever more money in tax-sheltered MSAs).  Furthermore, since NHI is a giant bureaucracy, it fails the epistemic access test.  First, according to Shapiro, this bureaucracy (apparently in collusion with doctors) determines the course of medical care, leaving the patient without information about all available options.  Second, the logistics of both the rationing decisions and the workings of the resultant waiting lists are hidden in the occult workings of the health bureaucracy and so are hidden from the individual patient.  MHI, on the other hand, is transparent: because each individual pays entirely for her own health care using funds from her MSA, the rationale behind the provision of care is transparent to the patient (except in the most catastrophic cases, where compulsory private insurance takes over).

Shapiro is wrong that we are largely responsible for our health habits and, consequently, our health. Consider, for example, that childhood access to decent food and exposure to healthy eating habits are important determinants both of adult health habits and health prospects.  If selling fresh vegetables and other healthy foods has a lower profit margin in some neighborhood than selling liquor, junk food, and sugary sodas, then selling the latter items in that neighborhood will likely predominate, resulting in that neighborhood having significant barriers to both childhood and adult health.  But, it is not a matter of option luck whether one grows up in a neighborhood dominated by corner stores in which the only 'vegetables' are wilting iceberg lettuce and ketchup.  Furthermore, it is not a matter of option luck whether one grows up in a family in which one's parents have the resources and education to prepare regular healthy meals for their children.  And yet, factors such as these -- both socially determined factors such as food availability and simple brute luck of who one's parents are -- determine the health habits of most members of modern, Western societies.

In short, given the educational, class, and racial political economies of contemporary societies, one's health opportunities are socially determined and so are matters of brute luck.  Since health status is largely a function of health opportunities, good health and its benefits are not proper objects of exclusive title, and conversely the burdens owed to one's bad health are not burdens from which one deserves to suffer.  Consequently, differences across populations in health and the consequences of those differences seem to be exactly the sorts of differences that, according to egalitarian principles, demand rectification through state action, i.e., through some form of national health insurance.

Shapiro is also wrong about the supposedly superior epistemic accessibility of MHI.  Because in MHI, individuals will usually pay for medical procedures out of personal MSAs, Shapiro claims that they will have more information about these procedures than those saddled with having to rely upon state insurance to pay for these procedures.  But what information do these parties with MSAs get that patients subject to NHIs don't get?  As Shapiro recognizes, the primary differential in information is information about the cost of the procedure (see, e.g., pp. 76-77, 79).  Those who must pay for their own health care out of private MSAs do not get better medical information than those with NHI.  Nor do they receive better information about what the quality of different treatment options are, or any other relevant medical information.  The only information to which they have distinctive access is its price.  And, since we are epistemically limited creatures, the introduction of a new source of information, especially if it is irrelevant to the matter at hand (viz., what the medically best options are), will not necessarily improve our epistemic position.  In fact, it might even degrade it.

Shapiro also argues that price information is valuable because it renders transparent the logic of rationing, while in NHI, rationing is conducted by impersonal and confusing bureaucracies.  He writes:

more people in MHI pay their own health bills with MSAs and fund their own catastrophic health insurance, and so 'rationing' is more self-imposed, based on the choice of one's health insurance plan and budgetary constraints.  The average person is likely to have a better understanding of the benefits and costs for him or her because choices based on one's own budget and values are more visible than politically imposed costs and subsidized care. (p. 146)

But, if there is one human institution that is truly opaque -- one institution that confronts the average person as deeply impersonal and mysterious -- it is the market.  Most people might understand supply-demand relationships in the abstract, but most do not have correct information about why some procedure or drug is costly while another is inexpensive, much less why their private health insurance premium and deductible cost what they do.  For Shapiro's "average person," prices, premiums, and deductibles are like changes in the weather: we don't try to understand them, we just try to deal with them.  So, what Shapiro is advocating is that we replace one rationing process whose logic is in principle epistemically accessible -- state rationing -- with another process whose functioning is about as epistemically opaque as human institutions come.

This problem is compounded for the working poor because (i) high barriers associated with understanding medical conditions and treatment options, and (ii) normal budgetary pressures of poverty, will likely generate a strong bias towards assigning irrationally high deliberative weight to price.  Price information then threatens to swamp whatever useful medical information might be available for deliberations about choice of medical care.  So, not only is price foregrounding epistemically occluding, it also warps practical deliberations by obscuring from deliberative view valuable medical information.

These reflections lay bare a fundamental flaw of this book: its failure to attend to the complexity of markets.  Take, for example, adverse selection in health insurance markets.  Adverse selection occurs when healthy people choose to forgo insurance leaving only those with high medical costs using standard health insurance.  Since insurance plans work by pooling the risks of all customers, if all low-risk parties abandon a health insurance plan, that leaves only the high-risk parties paying in and taking out.  Consequently, the plan will either collapse or, to survive, will raise its rates well beyond what most people can afford.  This is why private insurance companies spend a substantial amount of time and money screening applicants to determine whether they have, as a matter of brute luck, high-risk conditions (and then rejecting the high risk applicants), and seeking ways to deny coverage to existing customers who, due to brute luck, incur large health care costs.  The inefficiencies and injustices of adverse selection would likely be magnified in Shapiro's model since private catastrophic insurance is compulsory although only market regulated.  Under such a regime, low-cost insurers, in order to remain low-cost, will have to weed out high-risk applicants (Shapiro never argues that every insurer must accept any applicant), and all insurers, regardless of the cost of their premiums or the quality of their plans, will be under great financial pressure to find legal grounds to avoid full payment to customers who suffer catastrophic health events.[1]

Since adverse selection is hardly something that the "average person" knows about, we can chalk up yet another bit of epistemic opacity for MHIs.  But, it also remains Shapiro's responsibility to explain how adverse selection in MHI wouldn't generate the kinds of gross inefficiencies and unfair differentials in plan options that are endemic in existing private markets for health insurance.  This is especially pressing since many health economists believe that the most efficient and fairest response to adverse selection is NHI (even if they do not endorse NHI as the best overall solution).  Unfortunately, Shapiro doesn't once mention adverse selection or how to mitigate its effects in MHI (much less reference a serious scholarly article on the topic).  All told, this failure is not surprising since any libertarian (even in an egalitarian sheep's clothing) advocating market provision of health care over NHI would have strong incentives to turn a blind eye towards the many nasty, irrational, and opaque features of markets (especially since NHI health bureaucracies, complex and obnoxious as they can be, are in principle both epistemically accessible and democratically manageable).

Stepping back a bit, we can see that despite his apparent hewing to the letter of egalitarianism, Shapiro misses its spirit, which is that massive inequalities are generally products of macro-structural features of the world and are not due to poor choices made by individual actors.  This is not to say that the egalitarian denies the role of responsibility in justice.  Rather, egalitarians like, for example, Ronald Dworkin have long recognized that under ideal conditions, distributive shares should be primarily allocated purely in response to personal choice.  But, egalitarians have always recognized that ideal conditions abstract away from precisely the kinds of socially-determined obstacles that frustrate people's efforts at living healthily, receiving an education, making a living, etc.  In non-ideal conditions where facing these socially-determined obstacles is a matter of brute luck, from an egalitarian point of view any inequalities that are products of these obstacles ought to be rectified by the state as a matter of justice.

Let us turn finally to Shapiro's methodology, which calls for comparing institutions against one another instead of just assessing institutions without comparison.  While this methodology is laudable, Shapiro unfortunately rigs the game by comparing existing liberal welfare programs, warts and all, with pure models of libertarian programs.  But, if Shapiro can help himself to pure models of libertarian programs, then the liberal can do the same.  So, for example, Shapiro considers Social Security as it is presently constituted to be unjust because, for example, it involves an illiberal transfer of wealth across generations.  But, how about this unrealized liberal proposal: fund Social Security by a progressive payroll tax that kicks in at $200,000.  Such a tax would pay for Social Security fairly.  For, a portion of the income of those lucky enough to be young or vigorous (and high wage earners) would be transferred to those unlucky enough to have grown old.  And, it's beyond doubt that both being young and vigorous and being old and tired are not products of option luck.

Shapiro might scold the old and tired for not having saved up for that inevitable day when their shoulders would sag to the point that they could no longer bring home the bacon.  But, this claim is just a veil obscuring callous finger-wagging once we recall the systematic interrelationships between a vast array of socially-determined macro-factors and the life options each individual faces.  Unless one is born well-off and unless one receives a decent education, knowing how to plan carefully for both retirement and the high financial costs of being old (which requires understanding markets, investing, and accurately assessing how much to insure oneself against the unsheltered risks of putting savings into stocks and other volatile equities) is usually a matter of brute luck, especially if one is managing all this during the costly and unpredictable process of raising a family.

We can conclude that the admonition that individuals must take responsibility for their choices rings most truly and powerfully in cases of morally abhorrent behavior, i.e., in instances in which wrongs against others have been committed.  But, when this principle is transposed from the retributive key into the distributive key, as Shapiro does with respect to the distribution of health care and old age insurance, the sweet, complex melody of justice is reduced to a saccharine jingle.

[1] Shapiro's suggestion, at pp. 120ff, that health insurance companies have an enforceable obligation to provide, and policyholders and patients an enforceable right to demand, contractually guaranteed benefits is a non sequitur.  The costs of seeking legal redress against a major insurance company larded with high-paid attorneys are so massive that it is often a better bargain for the regular person not to bother, so the concern Shapiro should have is whether parties have effective rights.