Is There a Right of Freedom of Expression?

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Larry Alexander, Is There a Right of Freedom of Expression?, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 203pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521822939.

Reviewed by Ian P. Farrell, University of Wollongong, Australia


As the title suggests, in this ambitious and engaging book Alexander addresses whether there is a human right of freedom of expression. Human rights, to Alexander, are the pre-existing, universal moral rights presumed by such domestic and international legal instruments as the US Constitution and the International Convention on Civil and Political Rights. The existence of these underlying human rights is too often taken for granted. Alexander's skeptical analysis of freedom of expression is therefore both important and refreshing. His conclusion, however, that there is no human right to freedom of expression is undermined by a lack of argumentative rigor and a tendency to set up straw-man versions of freedom of expression for critique.

One of the inherent difficulties in writing a book review, of course, is attempting to critically engage with the book's arguments while still doing descriptive justice to the book itself, all in the space of a few pages. In this review I shall attempt to serve these two masters by giving a brief outline of the structure of Alexander's argument and the main justifications for his conclusions, before proposing a couple of specific, but hopefully representative, criticisms of the book's methodology and content.

Alexander's book is in three parts. Part One consists of "laying the foundation for the inquiry" (p. xi). The purpose of the book is to determine

whether there is, in fact, a universal moral right of freedom of expression to which … international and domestic legal instruments could be referring when they announce a legal right to freedom of expression, and if so, what its scope and content are. (p. 5)

This right will exist if there is a valid moral principle such that any person at any time and place has a valid claim that government not penalize or impede in certain ways his or her exercise of expressive liberty, appropriately defined. Alexander's first steps in attempting to demonstrate that no such principle exists consist in eliminating the less plausible forms that have been suggested for this principle, and focusing on the theory that represents the best prospect for establishing a right of freedom of expression. In this way, he delimits his inquiry to whether there is a deontological, negative right on the part of an audience that government not suppress or penalize an expressive activity for the purpose of preventing a message from being received. To be recognizable as freedom of expression, moreover, the principle "must entail a requirement that government, at least in its capacity as regulator, maintain a stance of evaluative neutrality vis-à-vis messages." (p. 11) This requirement of evaluative neutrality is, according to Alexander, "the problem at the heart of the enterprise" (p. xii) of attempting to justify freedom of expression. But more on that later.

In Part Two, Alexander analyses those laws he perceives as being at the core of freedom of expression, namely government actions taken for the purpose of affecting messages. Government regulations with this purpose constitute 'Track One' of the U.S. Supreme Court's First Amendment jurisprudence, and Alexander's engagement with the Court's free speech doctrine makes this the most 'legal' part of his book. The author's emphasis returns to more philosophical ground in Part Three. Alexander firstly addresses the various "general justifying theories", both deontological and consequentialist, that have been advanced in support of freedom of expression. After dismissing each of these individually, he goes on to diagnose a common -- and insurmountable ­-- problem faced by any justification of freedom of expression: the requirement of evaluative neutrality leads to a paradox.

This is the most important argument in the book, and I did not find it entirely convincing. Before I consider this claim in more detail, however, a number of relatively minor points are worth addressing. Alexander puts some effort in Part One into eliminating the less plausible justifications for freedom of speech. He dismisses, for example, consequentialist justifications of freedom of expression, and locates the right in the audience rather than the speaker. Yet the former conclusion appears to play no role in the structure of his later argument, as he gives consequentialist and deontological justifications equal treatment (as it were) in Part Three.

The latter conclusion (in addition to being interesting in its own right) demonstrates two further difficulties in Alexander's book. Firstly, the argument lacks the necessary rigor. Alexander admits that it is natural to think of freedom of expression as the right of the speaker but claims it is more plausible to think of the right as that of the audience and not the speaker. In support of this claim, Alexander proposes several situations in which freedom of expression appears to be implicated yet there is no speaker in whom the right could plausibly be located: a dead author; a child; a thousand monkeys on typewriters who accidentally bang out Das Kapital; a person watching a sunset who might "be inspired to have subversive thoughts." (pp. 8-9)

Some of these examples have force. While we could explain the deceased author example in terms of a right that outlasts his or her lifetime, this does not seem to capture why we object to the banning of a dead author. We object to Huckleberry Finn being banned in schools, for instance, not out of respect for the continuing rights of Mark Twain but rather because the prohibition prevents school children from the benefits of reading his book.

But this example does not justify Alexander's conclusion, and the other illustrations are less convincing. The sunset-watching scenario is particularly problematic. Because there is "no speaker of any sort" (p. 9, emphasis in original) there seems to be no speech (or expression) of any sort. There is certainly an audience for something -- an aesthetically inspiring natural occurrence, say -- but, whatever it is, it isn't expression[1]. In fact, if there is any expression taking place it is the conduct of the sunset watcher, who expresses his or her values or interests and tastes by taking the time to watch the sunset.

Alexander's proposition that the right to freedom of expression resides in the audience and not (directly) in the speaker faces a more telling difficulty, however. For just as Alexander has posed examples in which there is (purportedly) no speaker, there are situations in which freedom of speech is apparently implicated without an audience. Suppose the government bans swastika tattoos on the scalp even when hidden by a thick covering of hair, or bans teenagers from writing a diary even when kept under lock and key.[2] In each case there is no audience, except the speaker himself or herself. But neither the speaker-as-own-audience response, nor the possibility that someone will see the expression, captures why freedom of speech would be implicated in these cases.

Taken in conjunction with Alexander's examples, these cases demonstrate that freedom of expression (if it exists) is a right of both the speaker and the audience. While little ultimately turns on this point in terms of Alexander's fundamental conclusion that there is no right to freedom of expression, it does demonstrate a significant problem in the author's arguments as well as his occasional methodological slippage. For he rebuts a recent argument that freedom of expression is primarily a right of the speaker by claiming that the commentator "has difficulty explaining away three United States Supreme Court decisions." (Fn 14, p. 9.) The target of inquiry, however, is the nature and scope of the moral right to freedom of expression, not the United States legal right. With regard to the moral right, at least, the Supreme Court is not authoritative. While Alexander is working from the (entirely plausible) premise that the First Amendment invokes or incorporates the pre-existing moral rights, the precise contours of the legal right could be narrower (or indeed broader) than the moral right -- or the Supreme Court could simply have been wrong. Alexander routinely invokes First Amendment doctrine to support his views, but in terms of whether there is, in truth, a moral right to freedom of expression, the details of this doctrine are neither here nor there.

Alexander's ultimate conclusion that there is no right to freedom of expression rests, however, on a different argument, namely that the right is paradoxical. This argument takes a couple of forms, two of which I will address here.

The first form of the argument is marshaled in response to the proposition that freedom of expression is concomitant to democracy. (p. 137) Alexander refers to Schauer's observation that "freedom of expression is thought to oppose and trump democratic decisionmaking, even when those regulations have been democratically enacted." (p. 137)[3] Striking down democratically enacted laws in the name of democracy, Alexander claims, is surely paradoxical.

This argument implicitly draws on a thin, procedural conception of democracy: laws or decisions are democratic if they are made in conformity with some majoritarian process. Such a conception of democracy is unacceptably anemic. Consider a piece of legislation, democratically enacted, that imposes rule by the absolute fiat of a sovereign (perhaps as an electoral response to a leader of extraordinary charisma). Surely there is no contradiction involved in declaring such a law undemocratic[4]. Such a law has democratic parentage, but the law is not itself democratic. The same could plausibly be said of a law with democratic pedigree that purports to rescind freedom of expression, or of a valid law, passed with majority support that rescinds the franchise for a racial minority. The apparent contradiction disappears if a thicker notion of democracy is considered, incorporating substantive as well as procedural restraints. There are democratic reasons for valuing freedom of speech and racial equality, and so a purportedly 'democratic law' (one that was passed in accordance with a certain majoritarian process) is not a real democratic law in the deeper sense. This is not a new idea, for surely the most sensible way to understand constitutional limitations on majority will is as anti-majoritarian, but not undemocratic.

The second form of the paradox argument is that the requirement of evaluative neutrality in the right to freedom of expression leads to an unavoidable paradox. Alexander posits this as akin to the paradox resulting from liberalism generally. At the core of liberalism is the notion that "liberal government cannot impose its views of the Good on dissenters." (p. 147) But when this idea is "operationalized" (to borrow Alexander's term) "liberal government cannot help but be partisan." (p. 147) A liberal government applies the liberal form of governance to all members of a society, even those who disagree with liberalism. Liberalism is intolerant of intolerance.

While Alexander considers these arguments at some length, I shall concentrate on the further claim that freedom of expression is infected by the same inevitable paradox. The first point worth noting is that it's at least possible that a right to freedom of expression could exist independently of a broader theory of liberalism. Even if the paradox argument is fatal to liberalism, it does not necessarily follow that freedom of speech becomes impossible to maintain. Moreover, if we look at the requirement of evaluative neutrality in freedom of expression separate from the broader concerns of liberal governance, then there is no analogous paradox. While liberalism cannot tolerate intolerance, freedom of expression is perfectly able to handle expression that is anti-freedom of expression. The fact that the right to freedom of expression extends to Alexander's claim that freedom of expression does not exist, for instance, does not create a paradox in the way that someone who believes it is permissible to act with intolerance towards people of another race or sex creates a paradox for liberalism. To put it another way, there is not the same problem of "operationalizing" in relation to freedom of expression as with liberalism generally. The right to freedom of expression merely requires that a dissenter be allowed to say that there is such freedom; it does not require that a dissenter be free to restrict the speech of others.

Despite these argumentative shortcomings, Alexander's book is an accessible, clearly written work that covers a broad range of issues and theories relating to freedom of expression. His skeptical stance is both refreshing and ambitious -- it is, after all, difficult to prove the nonexistence of anything-- but not entirely convincing. There may be no human right of freedom of expression, but Alexander falls short of demonstrating this.

[1] A sunset could only be considered expression if it were the product of a creator. But Alexander poses the sunset hypothetical as an example of speech without a speaker, so this response to my criticism would be self-defeating.

[2] Thanks to Elisa Arcioni for the second example.

[3] Quoting Frederick Schauer, Free Speech: A Philosophical Enquiry 40-4 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982) (emphasis in Alexander).

[4] This example is similar to one presented in Lawrence G. Sager, Justice In Plainclothes: A Theory of American Constitutional Practice (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004), 165.