Isaac Newton on Mathematical Certainty and Method

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Niccolò Guicciardini, Isaac Newton on Mathematical Certainty and Method, MIT Press, 2009, 422pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262013178.

Reviewed by Michael Nauenberg, University of California, Santa Cruz



Guicciardini has written a very stimulating book that offers new insights on the development and application of Newton’s mathematical concepts and on his philosophical views about the nature of mathematics. Newton considered several questions that, according to Guicciardini, have been either overlooked or misunderstood by historians, e.g.,

When are mathematical methods endowed with certainty? How can one relate the common and new algebraic analysis of the moderns to the venerated methods of the ancients? When is a geometrical construction exact and elegant? What guarantees the application of geometry to mechanics?

The main focus of Guicciardini’s book centers on how Newton wrestled with these questions which, in the later part of his life, led to a considerable conflict between his views about algebraic and geometrical methods. To provide a background for his discussion, Guicciardini recounts in considerable detail several aspects of Newton’s early mathematical work found in his unpublished manuscripts edited by D. T. Whiteside in an indispensable 8-volume collection entitled The Mathematical Papers of Isaac Newton, and in Newton’s correspondence. In addition, Guicciardini describes some of the mathematical work of René Descartes, John Wallis, and Isaac Barrow, who were three of the most important influences in Newton’s early mathematical development. The latter part of the book is devoted to a discussion of Newton’s more mature mathematical practice as it appeared in the Principia. At the end of the book there is a very valuable list of references (20 pages long) which attests also to the substantial scholarly research that went into the writing of this book.

Guicciardini’s book begins with a detailed discussion of Descartes’ analytic method which Newton apparently studied on his own by reading van Schooten’s Latin translation of the Géometrié. In the 1659 edition, this translation also contains commentaries and additions from van Schooten and from some of his brilliant students, including Johannis Hudde (later to become mayor of Amsterdam), Hendrik van Heureat, and Christiaan Huygens. In particular, it was from this book that Newton first learned Hudde’s rule for the subtangent of an algebraic curve and Huygens’s first method to obtain the curvature of a parabola. Later in his life, Newton recalled that,

In ye year 1664 & ye winter following upon reading the Geometry of Des Cartes with his Commentators met with the method of Fermat in ye second book of Schooten’s commentaries,

and elsewhere he remarked,

In the winter between the years 1664 & 1665 I had a method of Tangents like that of Hudden, Gregory & Slusius & a method of finding the crokednes [curvature] of Curves at any given point.

In 1670 Newton learned that a rule comparable to Hudden’s had been obtained also by René de Sluse for curves that can be expressed by finite polynomials. Newton’s early manuscripts reveal that he extended these rules to algebraic curves containing fractional powers and quotients, and subsequently he developed similar algorithms based on his fluxional calculus. Newton adopted Descartes’ and Barrow’s description of geometrical curves by the continuous motion of a point, and introduced the concept of a fluxion to represent the instantaneous velocity of the point in terms of a fictitious time. For him, this representation must have seemed natural, because at the time he also was considering the motion of physical objects, e.g. the orbits of planets and of the moon for which velocity and time have real meaning.

Stimulated by reading Wallis’s 1656 Arithmetica Infinitorum, Newton conjectured that the finite binomial expansion for integer powers could be extended by interpolation to fractional powers, leading to an infinite series expansion. He convinced himself on the validity of his guesswork by comparing the first few terms of the expansion with the result obtained from algebraic root extraction and from division:

By considering how to interpole certain series of Dr Wallis I found the Rule … for reducing any power or dignity of any Binomium into an approximating Series, & in the following Spring, before the Plague, which invaded us that summer, forced me from Cambridge, I found how to do the same thing by continual division & extraction of roots… . And soon after I extended the Method to the extraction of the roots of affected Equations in species.

In Wallis’s book, Newton encountered also the important result that the area [integral] bounded by the curve y = xk is z = x(k+1)/(k + 1), which Wallis proved only for some integer values of k, but assumed to be valid also when k is a fraction (Fermat had proved it). Then, for curves that could be represented by infinite series expansion, Newton evaluated the area by summing the contribution of each term of the series. The significance that the tangent [derivative] of z is equal to y also did not escape Newton’s attention. In his scientific biography of Newton, Never at Rest, Richard Westfall pointed out that Newton had remarked that this connection may show the “nature of another crooked line that may be squared.”

Thus, “in the spring of 1665, Newton began seriously to explore this possibility to which this avenue could lead … He was repaid by the discovery of the fundamental theorem of the calculus.”

In the preface, Guicciardini lists among unexplained features of Newton’s penchant for secrecy the often asked question: “Why did Newton fail to print his method of series and fluxions before the inception of the priority dispute with Leibniz?” Manifestly, the history of the development of the calculus would have been quite different had Newton published his results earlier. Guicciardini attributes this failure to “the condition of stress and tension characterizing his thought on mathematical method.” But according to Whiteside, in 1669, when Newton found that Mercator had obtained the infinite power series expansion of the logarithmic function and other results similar to his own he "fought hard to have both his annotations on Kinckhuysen’s Dutch Algebra, and an extensive fluxional tract of his own [De Analysis] appear in bookshops." Barrow had told John Collins that

A friend of mine . . . that hath a very excellent genius to these things, brought me the other day some papers wherein he hath sett downe methods of calculating the dimensions of magnitudes like that of Mr. Mercator concerning the hyperbola, but very generall; as also of resolving aequations.

But “thwarted by the unsaleability of technical works at a time of acute depression in the book trade following the Great Fire in London, he ultimately relinquished hope of publication.” Instead, Collins circulated Newton’s manuscript De Analysis to a select group of mathematicians sometimes even without Newton’s consent. Evidently, during this early period Newton was eager to publish his result in mathematics. He realized, however, that the mathematical foundations of a calculus based on infinitesimal quantities was on shaky grounds. Moreover, he could not tolerate criticism, which in this case would have been unavoidable, “There is nothing wch I desire to avoyde in matters of Philosophy more than contention, nor any contention more than one in print.”

Then Newton’s attention became focused on other topics including optics and alchemy, and in 1684 he was prompted by Halley to engage in the intense task that, after three years of uninterrupted work, led to the Principia. Hence, one can understand that even Leibniz’s publication in the Acta Eruditorum of an algorithm for a differential calculus similar to his own, appearing the same year when Halley met Newton, did not prompt him into action.

Guicciardini presents Newton’s first geometrical proof of the fundamental theorem of the calculus commenting that “his reasoning strongly resembles Barrow’s Proposition 19 from Lecture 11” of the Lectiones Geometricae, published in 1671. But the question whether this resemblance is just a coincidence is left unanswered. In an earlier section of Guicciardini’s book Barrow’s proposition is reproduced together with his related Proposition 11 from Lecture 10 under a misleading title: Transmutation of Areas. In fact, in these propositions Barrow gives a remarkably rigorous mathematical proof of the fundamental theorem of the calculus — not just a “statement (perhaps too optimistically) of the fundamental theorem.” Guicciardini comments that “this lesson is likely to have polarized the attention of Barrow’s gifted student, who broached these two problems in the direct and the inverse method of fluxions, respectively.” But there is no evidence that by 1665 Barrow had given any lectures in Cambridge on these two propositions. Instead, M. Feingold has pointed out that

in the winter and spring of 1665, Barrow delivered the first 5 of the geometrical lectures … classes closed in the summer of 1665 by the plague not to resume until April 1666 when the plague returned by June and classes did not resume until Easter 1667.

The similarity of Newton’s and Barrow’s geometrical proofs suggests that Newton may have had a private lesson from Barrow. Alternatively, in one of van Schooten’s appendices Newton could have found von Heureat’s method for the arc length of a curve based on a geometrical construction which more directly resembled the one he employed.

Around 1668, James Gregory also employed Heureat’s construction to give a geometrical proof of the fundamental theorem. Hence, it is likely that Newton’s first geometrical proof of the fundamental theorem of calculus was based on earlier work, but as Guicciardini has shown, later he developed much more succinct and elegant geometrical proofs. Recently, historians, however, deny Barrow’s priority, and Guicciardini quotes Mahoney’s dismissive remarks that “what in substance becomes part of the fundamental theorem of the calculus is clearly not fundamental for Barrow,” and that “Barrow did not translate these propositions into an algorithm for determining areas in functions of antiderivatives.” But such an algorithm does not exist — what Barrow failed to do, and what Newton accomplished, as Guicciardini explains, was to create a table of integrals which relates functions to their derivatives. Such tables are obtained, up to the present, by the only known algorithm, which is differentiation.

In Book 1 of the Principia, Newton presented his Proposition in geometrical form, referring for mathematical proof to 11 Lemmas and Corollaries which describe some of his calculus rules also in geometrical form. In particular, he had developed his method of prime and ultimate ratios, Lemma 1, which established the calculus on firmer mathematical foundations. During the later dispute with Leibniz, he wrote anonymously, that:

By the help of this new Analysis Mr Newton found most of the Propositions in his Principia Philosophiae: but because the Ancients for making things certain admitted nothing into Geometry before it was demonstrated synthetically, he demonstrated the Propositions synthetically, that the Systeme of the Heavens might be founded upon good Geometry. And this makes it now difficult for unskillful men to see the Analysis by which those Propositions were found out.

Guicciardini argues that, although

it would be naive, of course, to take such a statement literally, it shows that Newton was claiming to be following a canon of problem solving whereby the analysis that allows one to answer a question should be neglected in the synthetic, demonstrative composition.

But from the extant manuscripts of the Principia, Whiteside concluded that there does not exist any evidence that Newton first applied the calculus in its analytic form to discover or to prove the central Propositions in the Principia. In those cases, however, where an integration had to be performed, he applied his analytic calculus, but left it to the reader to figure it out, with what must have been at the time an disconcerting remark “granting the quadrature of curves.”

As an example, Guicciardini discusses Prop. 41, Book 1, where the orbit of a particle moving under the action of a central force is given in terms of two integrals that remain to be calculated. In Corollary 3 of this proposition, Newton presented two solutions for the case of an inverse cube force in geometrical form, but as his correspondence with David Gregory reveals, these solutions were obtained by applying the analytic calculus. Surprisingly, Newton failed to consider the inverse square force which is the case of interest for his universal theory of gravitation. In 1710, the integration giving the conic section orbit was performed by Johann Bernoulli who later claimed that Newton could not perform it because he had not mastered the calculus. Moreover, with the appearance of this work and that of other continental mathematicians who were translating the Principia into the language of Leibniz’s differential calculus, Newton would have been reluctant to include details of his calculus, although he considered it in the second edition (1713) of his Principia, if only for fear that then he would have had to give credit for this development to mathematicians that he had begun to regard as his opponents.

Newton also developed a strong dislike for algebraic computations that, according to legend, he called “the mathematics of bunglers,” and he insisted that mathematics, to be certain, had to be expressed in geometrical form. Already in 1670 he had written

After the area of some curve has been found, careful consideration should be given to fabricating a demonstration of the construction which as far as permissible has no algebraic calculation, so that the theorem embellished with it may turn out worthy of public utterance,

and in 1694 he wrote to David Gregory, “Our specious algebra is fit to find out, but entirely unfit to consign to writing and commit to posterity.”

Ironically, had Descartes’s Geometry and Wallis’s Arithmetica Infinitorum not been “consigned to posterity”, it is doubtful that Newton would have learned the mathematical methods which then became the departure points for his monumental achievements. Since Archimedes’ time, algebra had been combined with geometry to calculate, for example, the length and the enclosed areas of curves. Infinite series expansions, which Newton and his contemporaries developed, were necessary to evaluate difficult integrals and to obtain transcendental constants like π and Euler’s constant e (calculated by Newton to a large number of decimal figures). Moreover, in several examples illustrated by Guicciardini, Newton could not have found solutions for his propositions in the Principia without applying his analytic calculus that he then kept hidden.

But Newton, more than any of his contemporaries, was also concerned with the lack of mathematical certainty or rigor in a calculus based on infinitesimals, which he called “moments,” Leibniz called “differentials,” and Bishop Berkeley called “the ghost of departed Quantities.” By introducing the method of prime and ultimate ratio of evanescent quantities, Newton paved the way to the establishment, in the 19th century, of the foundations of an analytic calculus that discarded its geometrical scaffolding and was based on a rigorous treatment of limits.

Newton’s quixotic quest to establish the calculus purely on geometrical grounds, “the venerated language of the Ancients,” Guicciardini tells us, “was a failure. He tried to reformulate his analytic methods of discovery into a synthetic form, a form in which all reference to algebraic analysis is suppressed — the equation is neglected — and the purity, unity and beauty of geometry [is] recovered,” and concludes that these views “determined Newton’s approach to publication, shaped his relationships with his acolytes, and influenced his strategy in his polemic with Leibniz”. Guicciardini’s book should become essential reading and an invaluable resource for anyone with a suitable background in mathematics who is interested in the history of the development of the calculus in the 17th century, and in the important role that Newton played in it.