Isaac Newton: Philosophical Writings

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Andrew Janiak (ed.), Isaac Newton: Philosophical Writings, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 190pp, $23.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521538483.

Reviewed by Ernan McMullin, University of Notre Dame


Unlike his predecessors, Bacon and Descartes, Newton did not leave behind a work explicitly devoted to what we would call his philosophy of science. Yet he had much to say about how the "experimental philosophy" should -- and almost as much about how it should not -- be carried on. He was wrestling also with cosmic issues like the nature of space and time and the relation of the material universe to its Creator. So passages of philosophical import are scattered everywhere in his published works as well as in his voluminous correspondence. The challenge for an editor who wishes to convert these into a single work for the modern reader is first, one of selection, and second, one of organization. That the task is a worthwhile one is evident: Newton's work more than that of any other was responsible for the separation into two distinct fields of what had, until Galileo initiated the process of separation, been one. But he himself was both philosopher and scientist, in terms of that later distinction. And his work had an enormous influence on the philosophers of the century that followed, up to its triumphant raising-up to transcendent status in the work of Kant.

A note on the back cover of the new volume reads: "In this volume, Newton's principal philosophical writings are for the first time collected in a single place." This quite surprisingly overlooks what has for a long time been a standard volume among those interested in the history and philosophy of science: H.S. Thayer's useful volume: Newton's Philosophy of Nature (1953) in the popular Hafner Library of Classics, still available. Inevitably, there is considerable overlap between the two volumes: two thirds of Janiak's text repeats the selections in the Thayer work which is itself 50% larger than the Janiak version, mainly because it contains the entire text of the thirty-one Queries from the Optics (Janiak settles for only two) and a considerable selection from Newton's writings on the theory of light and colors, passed over by Janiak. On the other hand, Janiak has a translation of the important early text, De gravitatione, previously available only in the somewhat unsatisfactory Hall and Hall translation of 1962, here happily amended by Christian Johnson and the editor. Janiak also includes two letters from Leibniz to Newton, a letter from Newton to Leibniz and one to Cotes, and a selection from Newton's anonymous response to Leibniz' criticisms in the Commercium Epistolilcum, dealing with the charge that Newton's gravity is no more than an occult quality. One further welcome addition in the Janiak volume is a twenty-page Introduction by the editor, rather more comprehensive than John Herman Randall's Introduction to the other volume.

Over the years since the Thayer selection of readings has been published, there has been a great deal of perceptive commentary on the issues raised by Newton's achievements in mechanics and optics and especially by his own reflections on their philosophical significance. Notable among the most recent contributions are I. Bernard Cohen's panoramic 370-page "A guide to Newton's Principia," appended as preface to the long-awaited new translation of the Principia by Cohen and Anne Whitman (1999); Isaac Newton's Natural Philosophy, edited by Jed Buchwald and I. B. Cohen (2001), and the impressive Cambridge Companion to Newton, edited by I. B. Cohen and George Smith (2002). These three constitute a final tribute to the tireless scholarly work of the late Bernard Cohen, who over forty years did so much for Newton scholarship.

Janiak's "Introduction" recalls several of the many philosophical disputes in which Newton engaged, each helpfully illustrated by the selection of readings provided in the new volume. Janiak tends in general to defend the propriety of Newton's own position in these disputes. A brief comment on perhaps the most interesting of these might be in order.

How is gravity, key to the entire achievement of the Principia, to be understood? Leibniz charged that it was an occult quality, occult in the sense that it purported to explain but did not explain, at least as Leibniz understood that term. To attribute a "dormitive virtue" to a particular substance (to recall Voltaire's later taunt), does not explain how the powder acts as its does. Ought it? It does, however, describe the action of the substance. In context, this could be very helpful information. Leibniz allows that attributing gravity universally to matter is helpful as information; thus, to say that Earth gravitationally attracts and is attracted by the sun can be construed as saying simply that earth and sun behave in a certain way when in a particular conjunction with one another. What Leibniz objects to is the implication that attributing gravity in this context somehow explains how these effects are brought about.

Newton's indignant response (articulated in some detail in Cotes' Preface to the second edition of the Principia) is that gravity is a cause of motion, though the cause of gravity itself he does not presume to know. Analyzing this notion of gravity as a cause years later, Berkeley argued that this was to reduce attribution of cause (rightly, in his view) to no more than invariable succession, since nothing is said about how the motion is actually brought about. From this to Hume and his influential analysis of causality with its skeptical implications was only a short step. But Newton would have disagreed with this way of interpreting his language. He had no wish to deny or to diminish the role of gravity as active agency. He had discovered, to his own satisfaction and to that of his followers, a complex form of agency that linked pendulum to moon, to planet, to comet. Admittedly, the manner in which it operated was mysterious. But he had been able to weave a tight mathematical web that made the action of gravity entirely predictable, both as the power to attract and the capacity to be attracted, the same measure applying to each.

Leibniz still had one further cogent objection to raise. When Newton spoke, as he often did, of the sun attracting or being attracted by a planet, the only sort of agency left open (it seemed) was that of action at a distance. And this was, by general agreement among philosophers from Aristotle's time onwards, simply inadmissible, as Newton himself indeed felt forced to concede. So the appeal to attraction was worse than mysterious, it could not even in principle succeed. Leibniz himself believed that a respectable sort of mechanical agency, after the fashion of Descartes' vortices, would fill the gap. But Newton had made his case even more vulnerable, it seemed, by showing that no sort of intervening medium possessing mechanical properties could be allowed: it would destabilize the planetary motions. And, as Cotes persuasively argued, the appeal to vortex action could not possibly explain the complexity of planetary and cometary motions, even apart from the earlier objection.

The only possibility left was some kind of non-mechanical agency, taking the term 'mechanical' in the contact-action sense demanded by the "mechanical" philosophy of the day. Newton never gave up hope that he might be able to hit upon such an agency and tried out "active principles" (perhaps inspired by his alchemical readings) and even a highly attenuated form of a traditional mechanical ether. Nothing came of these efforts,x but they do make it clear that Newton was not willing to abandon the new mechanics to the minimalism of Hume and those who later embraced Hume's lead.

Newton had, in effect, pioneered a new form of explanation, dynamic explanation, with the notion of force as its anchor. And the introduction of the notion of the field more than a century later showed that his hope of finding a non-mechanical form of agency that would bridge the gap between attractor and attracted had not been vain after all.