Isaac Newton's Scientific Method: Turning Data into Evidence about Gravity and Cosmology

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William L. Harper, Isaac Newton's Scientific Method: Turning Data into Evidence about Gravity and Cosmology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 424pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570409.

Reviewed by Robert Rynasiewicz, Johns Hopkins University


The title and dust jacket portrait of Newton eliciting the celebrated phenomenon of colors may lead one to think this is a comprehensive work on Newton's scientific method, including his experimental work in optics. The scope is narrower.

In the preface to the first edition of Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica, Newton writes, "For the whole difficulty of philosophy appears to be to discover the forces of nature from the phenomena and then to demonstrate the other phenomena from these forces." This program, for at least one force, is carried out in Book III of the Principia wherein Newton claims to establish the law of universal gravity primarily from Keplerian features of planetary and lunar motion and then to derive from this force the tides, the shape of the earth, the precession of the equinoxes, lunar anomalies and other phenomena. Harper's book focuses on the first half of this project, giving for the most part a running commentary with appendices on the first thirteen propositions of Book III and their corollaries, together with the three laws of motion.

This is a serious and learned work that will set a standard for future philosophical analyses of Newton's argument for universal gravitation. However, though it is extensively researched and filled with a wealth of historical detail, it will not set a new standard for Newton scholarship in the stricter sense, for it fails to contextualize its subject. The Principia went through three editions, and the relevant portions of Book III saw significant revisions over a span of forty years. Although Harper mentions many of the alterations, he does not query the reasons for these changes. The analysis is static, based on the third edition. On top of Newton is added a pile of statistical analyses of the data used and the parameters derived, all of which has a vindicatory upshot. Harper unabashedly proselytizes the method he claims to unearth.

All told, I think Harper gets very much right. In what follows, though, I shall dwell on some points and features I find especially wanting or off the mark.

The central message is that Newton's method in Book III "adds features that significantly enrich the basic hypothetico-deductive (HD) model of scientific method" (p. 373). To those familiar with Newton's hypotheses non fingo from the General Scholium added to the second edition, this may ring out of tune. Newton was staunchly opposed to the method of hypotheses, demanding instead that propositions about the causes and properties of appearances, including the laws of motion, be inferred from the phenomena. Why is this not just antithetical to the HD model? So, why Harper speaks of Newton's method as an enrichment of hypothetico-deductivism is a bit of a mystery. It's not as though Harper does not emphasize these remarks from the General Scholium. Perhaps, though, we are simply to take it for granted that successful prediction ordinarily lends support to theory. But there is no indication in Newton's writings that he took this to be the case. To the contrary, Newton dismissed the method of hypotheses on the grounds that alternative hypotheses are always available, and thus there should be no reason that a consequence of a proposition should lend support qua consequence to that proposition as opposed to some contrary proposition that also entails it.

Perhaps this is too much of a quibble. What are the additional features that "enrich" the HD model? Harper lists three. (1) "An ideal of empirical success richer than prediction," i.e., ''in addition to accurate prediction of the phenomena a theory purports to explain, this richer ideal of empirical success requires that a theory have those phenomena accurately measure the parameters which explain them." (2) The conversion of "theoretical questions into ones which can be empirically answer by measurement from phenomena." (3) The provisional acceptance of theoretical propositions inferred from phenomena as guides to further research. Harper claims that "all three . . . come together in a method of successive approximations in which deviations from the model developed so far count as new theory-mediated phenomena that aid in developing a more accurate successor model" (pp. 2-3, italics in original).

Item (3) directly echoes Newton's fourth rule of reasoning: In experimental philosophy, propositions gathered from the phenomena by induction should be considered either exactly or very nearly true notwithstanding any contrary hypotheses, until yet other phenomena make such propositions either more exact or liable to exceptions. Just how (2) is supposed to differ from (1) is not altogether clear to me. We can see (1) in action in the first few propositions of Book III.

From the three laws of motion, it follows in Book I that the centripetal force on a body is directed toward a point in the interior of its orbit if and only if it sweeps out equal areas in equal times with respect to that point. Moreover, slight deviations from the point around which equal areas are swept yield slight deviations from the area law with respect to the point of deviation. Thus the extent to which the area law holds with respect to Jupiter measures the extent to which the force holding its satellites in orbit is directed toward Jupiter. Since the area law for Jupiter is one of the six Phenomena of Book III in the third edition, it follows that there is a centripetal force directed toward Jupiter holding its satellites in orbit. This is an example of deduction from the phenomena. Similarly for the primary planets with respect to the sun and the moon with respect to the earth.

It also follows in Book I that for circular orbits Kepler's period law is satisfied if and only if the centripetal force is an inverse square force. This establishes that the forces keeping the moons of Jupiter and, at least to approximation, the planets in their orbits are inverse square forces. More accurately, the latter is established by the quiescence of the aphelia, which holds for nearly circular orbits if and only if the force is an inverse square force. A similar argument applies to the moon. In general here, features of the motions measure properties of the force while the force explains the motions.

For the next two inferences, that it is the force of gravity holding (i) the moon and (ii) the planets and their moons in orbit, Newton appeals to his first two rules of reasoning: first, that we are to admit no more causes of natural things than such as are both true and sufficient to explain the phenomena, and second, that therefore we must assign, as far as possible, the same causes to the same natural effects. The status of these rules (and the third rule, see below) poses a classic dilemma for Newton. If they are supposed to hold a priori, then Newton cannot claim to be a strict empiricist; if they are empirically justified, what is the evidence they lead to truth? Where Harper stands is unclear. He tells us, "that the application of Newton's first two rules of reasoning to argue from the moon-test to the identification of the force holding the moon in its orbit with terrestrial gravity is backed up by this ideal of empirical success," where now this ideal includes the idea that "theoretical parameters receive convergent accurate measurements from the phenomena [the theory] purports to explain." (p. 160) The "measurements" in this case are the rate of free fall of terrestrial objects and the rate of fall the moon would have at the surface of the earth on the assumption of an inverse square law force. Given the law of universal gravity, these indeed would count as convergent measurements of the same parameter. But the rules are applied on the way to deriving the law. At that stage of the argument we have two parameters and we are seeking a justification for treating them as a single parameter. If the rules are sound, then we are justified.

Newton completes his argument for the law of universal gravitation in two more steps. First, he argues that all bodies are gravitationally attracted to every planet, and that the strength of the attraction is proportional to the mass of the attracted body (Proposition 6). Oddly, Newton gives no argument for the first conjunct. He does argue as Corollary II that, universally, all bodies on or near the earth gravitate toward the earth, and justifies it by his third rule of reasoning, that those qualities of bodies that cannot be intended and remitted and that belong to all bodies on which experiments can be made should be taken as qualities of all bodies universally. This is the only application of the third rule in the Principia. Harper, though, has it that Newton applies the third rule for the first conjunct. Perhaps he should have, but it is still a fact, however ugly, that he did not. Second, Newton argues that all bodies have a power of gravitational attraction proportional to their mass. Harper marks this as "the conceptual transition from gravity as centripetal forces toward planets to gravity as a universal force of pair-wise interaction between bodies" (p. 290) Harper also writes:

The extension to include interactive gravitation of bodies toward parts of planets would count, in Newton's day, as an extension to include interactive gravitation between all bodies within reach of experiments. This makes Rule 3 endorse extending interactive gravity to all bodies universally. (p. 41)

However, Newton does not invoke the third rule in the proof of this proposition. Harper also cites the third rule (and the fourth) in his discussion of Newton's evidence for the third law of motion. Of course, the rules of reasoning appear only at the outset of Book III. So much has to be considered as counterfactual history of what Newton might have or ought to have done.

By failing to contextualize, though, Harper misses the whole point for the introduction of the third rule. As he duly notes, the first three rules are introduced as rules only in the second edition, and the fourth rule in the third. In the first edition, the first two appear as Hypotheses I and II, respectively, and instead of the third rule there is a Hypothesis III that reads, "Any body can be turned into another body of whatever kind, and can assume successively every degree of quality in between.'' This Hypothesis is subsequently used in the proof of Corollary II of Proposition 6 (and only in that proof). The argument is that if the ether or any other body were devoid of gravity, that quantity of matter could gradually be changed into a body that does have weight, and thus whether a body has weight depends on its form. But it was established in Corollary I that the weights of bodies do not depend on their forms or textures. Thus, the purpose of Corollary II, and thus of the third rule, is to argue against any vortex theory of gravity, which would have the weight of bodies result from a pressure exerted on them by a swirling subtle matter. The subtle matter itself must have weight. This is completely lost on Harper, who takes the universality to concern bodies "however far they may be away from the earth" (p. 280).

The Hypotheses of the first edition are nine in number. Hypotheses V-IX appear as Phenomena in the second and third editions. Hypothesis IV appears as Hypothesis I and reads, "The center of the system of the world is at rest." Concerning it Newton writes, "This is acknowledged by all." About Hypothesis I Harper writes, "Clearly, Newton is not endorsing this claim." (p. 98). Thus, according to Harper, we can't take Newton at his word. And somehow the reader of the first edition, without any clue whatsoever, is supposed to figure out that Newton affirms Hypotheses I-III and V-IX, but not Hypothesis IV. Moreover, Newton's A Treatise of the System of the World, reads:

the common center of gravity of [the solar system] (by Cor. 4 of the Laws of motion) will either be quiescent, or move uniformly forward in a right line: In which case the whole system will likewise move uniformly forward in right lines. But this hypothesis is hardly to be admitted. And therefore setting it aside, that common center will be quiescent. (Newton [1731] 2004, p. 49)

Harper simply refuses to take Newton at his word when it comes to absolute space and motion. He claims that the distinction between absolute rest and motion "allows him to, provisionally, make sense of earth-centered and sun-centered hypotheses" (p. 98) and "Newton's solution to the two chief world systems problem does not depend on his hypothesis that the center of the system of the world is at rest'' (p. 311). Harper believes the problem is solved by fixing "the true motions of these bodies among themselves" (p. 311). Even if the oxymoron is removed by talking about motions relative to the center of mass of the solar system, it still does not solve the problem: the problem, at least as it was conceived in the 17th century, presupposes a distinction between true and merely apparent motion (whether one believes in absolute space or not) with no tertium quid. The predicates "x moves (truly)" and "x is at rest" were, with the possible exception of Huygens, universally regarded as complete and contradictory predicates. In Catholic countries, one had to be most careful as to what one predicated them of, as Galileo and Descartes knew full well. Again, Harper's Newton is hardly the historical Newton.


Newton, I. [1731] 2004. A Treatise of the System of the World. Mineola, N.Y.: Dover Publications.