Isaiah Berlin and the Enlightenment

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Laurence Brockliss and Ritchie Robertson (eds.), Isaiah Berlin and the Enlightenment, Oxford University Press, 2016, 258pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198783930.

Reviewed by Charles Blattberg, Université de Montréal


The fox, it seems, was wrong about many things. Isaiah Berlin's accounts of Marx are "all flawed in non-trivial ways," writes David Leopold (p. 23). And "there is no doubt that he penned a few [falsehoods] about Hume," asserts P.J.E. Kail (p. 69). Karen O'Brien tells us that "Berlin does not provide anything resembling an accurate or rounded account of Montesquieu's thought," while Christopher Brooke complains that "Berlin never seems to have felt that he really had to engage with Rousseau as a serious theorist" (pp. 79, 93). Marian Hobson concludes that Berlin is mistaken to think that either Diderot or Hamann "fit into a simple category" (p. 112). Ritchie Robertson insists that Berlin would have recognized how Machiavelli is part of an alternative, minority branch of the Enlightenment if not for his "at best incomplete" account of it (p. 139). John Robertson declares Berlin's portrayal of Vico "historically incoherent" (p. 159). And Kevin Hilliard feels a need to note that he is "certainly not claiming that Berlin was all wrong" when it comes to his account of Herder (p. 174). Lastly, we hear from Ken Koltun-Fromm that Berlin's description of Moses Hess is more or less "seriously flawed and misguided," and from Derek Offord that Berlin is "very partial" about the members of the Russian intelligentsia, indeed so much so that he takes us outside "the realm of scholarship, as we tend to conceive of it in early twenty-first-century academe, and in the direction of apology" (pp. 177, 199).

In fact, among the chapters on Berlin and individual thinkers, only Alan Ryan's refrains from voicing severe criticism of Berlin. Ryan essentially compares the different approaches that Berlin and Mill take to liberalism. There is an implicit rebuke, however. Because Berlin's essay on Mill argues that the latter is merely a "professed" utilitarian, someone "officially" committed to the principle of happiness, to be sure, but the meaning of this happiness "is stretched to the point of vacuity" (Berlin 2002, pp. 234, 223, 226). To Berlin, that is, Mill is a pluralist like himself. Yet this is a claim that Ryan is unwilling even to entertain.

Evidently, these criticisms go beyond the parsing one expects whenever a wide-ranging thinker is put to the test by specialists. Perhaps this accounts for Laurence Brockliss' remark, early in the introductory chapter, that Berlin is today considered largely irrelevant by philosophers and intellectual historians. Brockliss adds, however, that Berlin is enormously respected by the wider educated public. That Brockliss considers this a "paradox" (p. 1) is telling, since it implies that he both holds an elitist conception of the academy and is an epistemic democrat. Transposing this position into a Platonist register, one might say that it's not only monist academics who can lay claim to the truth, but also pluralist hoi polloi who remain inside the cave, fixated on the shadows along its walls. Perhaps, then, an addendum to Gilles Deleuze and Felix Guattari's magic formula (1987, p. 20) is in order:  Monism = Pluralism = Truth. 

Regardless, Brockliss also tells us that, in addition to probing this paradox, it's a purpose of the book he has co-edited to evaluate Berlin "not as a philosopher or defender of Western liberalism, but as a historian of ideas" (p. 12). Berlin, however, would be among the first to point out that, in his case, the three are intimately connected. We've just seen that his version of liberalism is closely related to his pluralist moral and political philosophy, to which I would add that the book's chapters dedicated not to specific thinkers but to the Enlightenment and Counter-Enlightenment in general can be considered incarnations of the bridge that exists between Berlin's work as a historian of ideas and his work as a philosopher. To Berlin, the cores of the two intellectual movements correspond to the fundamental philosophical division that he recognizes between monism and pluralism, respectively.

And what do these chapters say about Berlin the hedgehog, who knows one big thing? Once again, it doesn't look good. Brockliss and Robertson's joint chapter argues that Berlin's way of distinguishing between the Enlightenment and the Counter-Enlightenment is crudely dichotomous: his portrait of the former is not only extremely narrow in its skewed focus on the philosophes and the British but it also, astonishingly, excludes the Germans in toto, not least Kant. And since this problem is only compounded by Berlin's antithetical portrayal of the Counter-Enlightenment, Brockliss and Robertson conclude that Berlin's constructions have "an element of myth-making" about them (p. 46). Avi Lifschitz would agree; moreover, his chapter reveals just how much Berlin inherited all of this from Friedrich Meinecke, who was someone for whom the Jews were "co-responsible for the virulence of German anti-Semitism" (p. 59). Finally, T. J. Reed is clearly exasperated by the "extreme oversimplification," "fanciful extrapolation," and "massive misjudgment" that characterize Berlin's account of the Enlightenment, in which "the accusations get wilder as the references to specific individuals and texts get thinner, and it all dissolves into hot air" (pp. 115, 118, 119, 116). Perhaps most unforgivable is that Berlin, who famously appealed to Kant's maxim about how nothing straight can be made out of the crooked timber of humanity, got it "wrong on every possible count" (p. 117). For the maxim was no exception to a normally utopian Kant, advocate of a rigorous moralism; rather, it reflects both his realism about the way things and people currently are and his legitimate idealism about the establishment of "a perfect civil constitution" (p. 117).

Reed offers a psychological explanation. Berlin, he claims, was so traumatized as a child by what he witnessed during the Russian Revolution that it left him with a mindset for which only disaster can come from hubristic, high-minded intentions. Essentially, Reed is suggesting that Berlin the philosopher had such a distorting influence on Berlin the intellectual historian because the former suffered from a mental disorder. Worse, it seems to have been contagious, at least if Jeremy Waldron's chapter is any indication. The chapter leads the section entitled "Berlin's Legacy" and it concludes with Waldron bemoaning how Berlin, given his focus on moral and political concepts instead of institutions and social systems, has encouraged so many to treat political theory "more as a branch of ethics than as the theoretical and normative side of the institutional structures that fascinate our colleagues in political science" (p. 219).

Along the way, Waldron also takes Berlin to task for misinterpreting Kant's line about the crooked timber; indeed, Waldron (twice) mentions the possibility that Berlin did this sort of thing on purpose, since Kant's insight gives the lie to Berlin's assumption that "Enlightenment social design was arrogant and monistic, seeking a fatuous reconciliation of all values and a comprehensive solution of all conflicts in a glittering work of reason" (p. 213). It does so because Kant's point is the fundamentally realistic one that, people being the selfish animals they are, we need to face up to the genuine problems of organizing a state. And this, supposedly, is exactly what is achieved by the Enlightenment constitutionalism that Berlin almost completely ignores. The "Founding Fathers" of the United States, for example, formulated their country's constitution in a pluralist spirit precisely in order "to house rather than reconcile the pursuit of competing and incommensurable values" (p. 213). Moreover, the constitution "was presented to the American people during the ratification process in a spirit of humility as a modest, pragmatic, and experimental compromise. Nobody said it was perfect" (p. 214). So we can understand why Waldron closes his chapter on a wistful note, expressing regret that he had to be so disrespectful of Sir Isaiah. Still, he considers this a price worth paying if it brings greater interest in and a better understanding of Enlightenment constitutionalism.

But Waldron should feel regret for a different reason, because Enlightenment constitutionalism is monistic. If I'm right, then Michael Ignatieff misses the mark when, in his chapter, he tries to defend Berlin by claiming that he simply took the salutary teachings of this constitutionalism for granted. For support, Ignatieff cites a letter in which Berlin says that liberty can only be secured within a framework of constitutionally entrenched rights. But this ignores Waldron's point that Madison and the other Federalists were skeptical about mere "parchment barriers," which is why they emphasized the "structural principles of a constitution" instead (p. 215). And it's true that, when we read Federalist No. 51, we find the claim that the best way to prevent the majority from oppressing a minority is to favor the second, and not the first, of two possible methods: "The one by creating a will in the community independent of the majority, that is, of the society itself; the other by comprehending in the society so many separate descriptions of citizens, as will render an unjust combination of a majority of the whole, very improbable" (Hamilton, Madison, and Jay 1982, p. 264). This second method requires constitutional principles that will encourage a dynamic whereby competing groups will be balanced. When factions are played off against each other, citizens will come to internalize an ethics of reciprocity and so identify with a state that transcends the interests of any particular group. As Madison puts it elsewhere, "the great desideratum in Government is such a modification of the Sovereignty as will render it sufficiently neutral between the different interests and factions" (2006, p. 41).

Waldron points out that all this goes with a "conception of a society's constitution as something like a machine with weights, springs, ratchets, ballasts, escapements, and centrifugal governors . . . . The Enlightenment constitutionalists were the engineers and scientists of this machinery" (p. 209). So they were. But isn't engineering an applied science? That is, mustn't it, if it is to work, assume causality as well as laws interlocked within a unified system? And doesn't this mean that it is monistic? After all, balancing values housed within a unity is one thing, but balancing those of a plurality is quite another: the former can, supposedly, be performed without moral taint (utilitarianism is the most obvious example), while the latter often requires dirty, even (in the worst cases) tragic, compromises.

One of the reasons Waldron misses this is that he fails to recognize a distinction -- one that Berlin, it must be said, elides as well (e.g. Berlin 2013) -- between unity and perfection. Of course, the two often go together; only those who cherish fragmentation (Rabbinic Jews, say, or Modernist artists) could consider something disunified as perfect. Still, to most, unity is, crudely put, a necessary but not sufficient condition for perfection, and the leading candidates for the other condition are opposites: completion or the capacity for further development. Which one you favor will depend upon your attitude to infinity. If, like most ancient Greeks, you find it disturbing, even frightening, then you will tend to apply a superlative like perfection to something finite and so capable, say, of Aristotelian entelechy. But if, like monotheists and most moderns, you see infinity in a positive light, then you will assume that nothing finite could possibly be perfect. Accordingly, many modern political thinkers -- Kant and Madison among them -- are monists for whom we have not yet, and indeed may never, achieve perfection. While they believe that it is possible, here and now, to formulate and implement a unified moral or political vision, they admit that there may always be room "to form a more perfect Union." This still doesn't exhibit a spirit of humility, however; on the contrary, it's just the kind of thing one would expect to find introducing a text that has come to be worshipped by many as the basis of a civil religion. After all, didn't Moses inform us that God is One (Deut. 6:4)? If Waldron is interested in a constitution that's recognized as the product of modest, pragmatic, and experimental compromise, then he should look north of the 49th parallel. Here's what John A. Macdonald had to say in his speech endorsing the resolutions that would later become the British North America Act (1867): "The whole scheme of Confederation, as propounded by the Conference, as agreed to and sanctioned by the Canadian Government, and as now presented for the consideration of the people, and the Legislature, bears upon its face the marks of compromise" (1865, p. 31).

So Berlin the pluralist was right to oppose Enlightenment constitutionalism. He knew that the neutral state will inevitably neutralize all those hapless, incommensurable "others" who do not fit within its ostensibly unified, Procrustean machine. Indeed this is why, for "as long as there have been [social] engineers," to paraphrase Karl Kraus, "the house has been getting less habitable" (2013, p. 137).

That Berlin appears to have pursued his struggle with monism while writing intellectual history is unfortunate, however. I'm not qualified to pronounce on the various criticisms, evoked above, of his work in the history of ideas, but I must say that many of them strike me as having the ring of truth. In fact, as Brockliss and Robertson point out, Berlin himself came to admit that his portrait of the Enlightenment had a polemical bias: "The positive element, and the rich variety and undogmatic humanism, of much of the Enlightenment is, for obvious polemical reasons, not allowed enough by me; and perhaps the picture of the Enlightenment is too much of an Aunt Sally," i.e. a straw man (p. 43). Maybe this was only to be expected. Because if you believe that there is a plurality of incompatible truths, then it makes sense to fight for the ones you favor.

Nevertheless, I think that part of what Berlin was trying to do with all of the polemics was to attract our attention so that he could tell us something important. While I personally subscribe to neither monism nor pluralism, I evidently accept the reality of the two camps as well as the immense significance of the things that divide them. We all owe Berlin a great debt for the way he introduced the classic metaphysical theme of the One and the Many into contemporary moral and political philosophy.


Berlin, Isaiah. 2002. "John Stuart Mill and the Ends of Life," in Liberty: Incorporating Four Essays on Liberty, ed. Henry Hardy. Oxford University Press.

Berlin, Isaiah. 2013. "Vico and the Ideal of the Enlightenment," in Against the Current: Essays in the History of Ideas, ed. Henry Hardy. Princeton University Press, 2nd ed.

Deleuze, Gilles and Felix Guattari. 1987. A Thousand Plateaus: Capitalism and Schizophrenia, trans. Brian Massumi. University of Minnesota Press.

Hamilton, Alexander, James Madison, and John Jay. 1982. "The Federalist No. 51: Madison (6 February 1788)," in The Federalist Papers, ed. Garry Wills. Bantam Books.

Kraus, Karl. 2013. "Nestroy and Posterity (1912)," in The Kraus Project: Essays by Karl Kraus, ed. and trans. Jonathan Franzen. Farrar, Straus and Giroux.

Macdonald, John A. 1865. "Speech to the Legislative Assembly (6 February 1865)," in Parliamentary Debates on the Subject of the Confederation of the British North American Provinces: 3rd Session, 8th Provincial Parliament of Canada. Hunder, Rose & Company.

Madison, James. 2006. "Vices of the Political System of the United States (1787)," in Selected Writings of James Madison, ed. Ralph Ketchum. Hackett Publishing Company.