Isn't That Clever: A Philosophical Account of Humor and Comedy

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Steven Gimbel, Isn't That Clever: A Philosophical Account of Humor and Comedy, Routledge, 2018, 196 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138082151.

Reviewed by Darren Hudson Hick, Furman University


Timing is critical in comedy, and Steven Gimbel has good timing. Lucky timing, at least. It's been an interesting year for comedians.

As I write this, politicians, pundits, and journalists are still sorting through the aftermath of Michelle Wolf's performance at the 2018 White House Correspondents' Dinner. Traditionally, the event includes a featured comedian, who proceeds to roast the sitting administration, including the President of the United States, and usually to his face. At the best of times, a roast involves a very delicate balance of wit and bite; there is a reason that roastmasters at the Friars Club (and, more often than not, the roastees) are seasoned comics. Roasting a president and his administration is master-level stuff. Several of George W. Bush's staffers walked out during Stephen Colbert's roast at the 2006 dinner, and Bush himself was reportedly visibly incensed. But this is atypical. Normally, the comedian on stage reigns in the jabs a bit, and the president laughs along with a bit of pointed ribbing. But Donald Trump was not in attendance at the 2018 dinner; instead, he sent his press secretary Sarah Huckabee Sanders to sit in his stead. And it was Wolf's jab at Sanders that made the headlines:

I actually really like Sarah. I think she's very resourceful. Like, she burns facts, and then she uses that ash to create a perfect smoky eye. Like, maybe she's born with it, maybe it's lies. It's probably lies.[1]

The initial backlash -- from the press and politicos alike -- was swift and brutal. Wolf was accused of crossing a line. Margaret Talev, President of the White House Correspondents' Association, released a statement the next morning:

Last night's program was meant to offer a unifying message about our common commitment to a vigorous and free press while honoring civility, great reporting and scholarship winners, not to divide people. Unfortunately, the entertainer's monologue was not in the spirit of that mission.

President Trump has suggested overhauling or eliminating the event altogether.

The primary asset of this book is that it gives us an analytic architecture and linguistic tools for analyzing cases like Wolf's. Wolf opens her set: "I'm here to make jokes. I have no agenda. I'm not trying to get anything accomplished. So, everyone that's here from Congress: you should feel right at home." This is humor; it's at least a little clever (which, as Gimbel's title might suggest, is central to his view). But the rest of her set belies her claims to be innocent of agenda. Her closing line is: "Flint still doesn't have clean water!" There is no joke attached to this line; it's all agenda. Most of what Wolf says in her set consists in jokes -- many of them awkwardly delivered -- but they're not what Gimbel would call "pure jokes". Their purpose is not merely to make the crowd laugh; they are "impure" (where that opening jab would seem purer, at least). Indeed, journalists, politicians, and pundits were surprised by just how impure Wolf's set was, both in terms of motive, and in terms of delivery. Much of it was what Gimbel calls "rough" comedy -- there is more swearing that one normally expects to hear on C-Span. Wolf was partisan in her content and at least a bit raunchy in her delivery. But, as she says to the crowd, "You shoulda done more research before you got me to do this." And, if this is her style, she would seem to have a point. But Gimbel might suggest that Wolf bears the ultimate responsibility for any offense -- that it is Wolf who "shoulda done more research." Gimbel could easily have written a chapter on Wolf's 20-minute set.

Chapters 1, 2, and 3 of Gimbel's book do the analytical heavy lifting; Chapters 4 and 5 are largely taxonomic (they're very interesting, but I won't be dealing with them here); and Chapters 6 through 8 deal with a range of ethical questions pertaining to humor and comedy.

Chapter 1 ("The Obligatory Chapter") is hilarious. I could easily spend this entire review on how good of a read it is. I don't actually enjoy a lot of philosophical writing, but Gimbel handily explains the array of extant views in a thoroughly compelling manner, only to -- just as compellingly -- sweep the legs out from under them. At the same time, he deftly manages the delicate balance of rigorous analysis and amusement, dancing lightly along some fairly heavy blocks. It makes me a little sad that I -- unlike Gimbel -- have yet to seamlessly incorporate the phrase "the sound of a fart" (29) into a serious philosophical text. In his acknowledgments, Gimbel thanks the members of the "Lighthearted Philosophers' Society." I don't know who they are, but I want in.

Chapters 2 and 3 lay out the core of his theory: that humor is "intentional, conspicuous playful cleverness," and that jokes have locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary force. These chapters are more analytically dense than the opening chapter, but Gimbel still manages to make the reading amusing and compelling.

The idea that humor consists in intentional, conspicuous playful cleverness is meant to offer an account that is broader than relief accounts of humor (like Sigmund Freud's), but with constraints that Gimbel argues incongruity accounts (like Noël Carroll's) have thrown aside. Humor, Gimbel argues, is clever in that it displays a cognitive virtue (say, being creative, or showing breadth of knowledge); it is playful in that it uses something (a word, a concept, a prop) in something other than its originally intended use; and it is conspicuous in that it is an aesthetic act intended for an audience. To take a key example, comic wordplay (when done well) cleverly manipulates linguistic ambiguities for the sheer pleasure of playing with words.

Humor often takes the form of jokes, which are typically linguistic in nature (though not always: practical jokes are jokes on Gimbel's account). And, like other intentional linguistic things, Gimbel argues, they are locutionary in nature (they are meaningful strings of sounds or symbols meant to be comprehended by the audience), illocutionary (they have functions as conveyers of meaning), and perlocutionary (they can be employed for ends beyond conveying meaning).

Humor is something we can appreciate for its own sake. But, Gimbel emphasizes throughout the book, humor can be employed for any number of disparate perlocutionary functions: to make someone feel bad, to make someone laugh, to make someone believe something new. So, while humor is necessarily intentionally clever, it isn't necessarily intentionally funny. The aesthetic appreciation of humor occurs in a play frame: "a special aesthetic stage removed from normal life and conversational flow on which to perform the gag" (39). That is, appreciating a gag means appreciating it as a gag -- as a bit of intentional, conspicuous playful cleverness. Comedians -- those who engage in writing and performing humor -- erect a range of dedicated play-frame spaces for delivering this material to an audience: the comedy club, late night television, some particular table in the middle school lunch room (comedy isn't necessarily professional comedy, after all).

Gimbel's theory is rich and interesting, but there's something . . . funny about excising funniness from the core account of humor. Consider Mark Grieve and Ilana Spector's Bike Arch (2007), a 24-foot high archway built from discarded bicycles, all welded together in the Black Rock Desert. Temporarily installed in Pershing, Nevada, the arch formed the entrance to the 2007 Burning Man festival. Bike Arch was intentionally made; it was certainly creative, and so qualifies as clever on Gimbel's account; it uses bicycles in a manner outside their original, intended function, and so qualifies as playful; and no one would question that it is aesthetically conspicuous. I could use many words to describe Bike Arch: it is imposing, it is curious, it is whimsical, it is industrial; but I would not describe it as humorous, despite being an apparently clear case on Gimbel's view. The fact that I don't find it funny, that no one else finds it funny, and indeed that it was not intended to be funny is, according to Gimbel, altogether irrelevant to whether the work is a humorous work. And that's funny (funny-strange, not funny-haha).

Gimbel's motivation to excise funniness from his account of humor seems to be his desire to account for an array of functions of humor, thereby allowing him to make a distinction between pure and impure jokes. He seems to be thinking of such things as "Yo Mama" contests, insult comedy, the use of humor for educational purposes, and such activities as Andy Kaufman's bizarre foray into professional wrestling. But even when the end-goal is to defame an enemy, or to instill a life lesson, it seems that what marks an activity as humor is the goal to evoke laughter, or something on what we might call the "mirth spectrum" from smirk to full-on belly-laugh (even if the target of the joke is not the one who is supposed to be laughing). As for Kaufman, I suppose I would question whether what he was doing with those wrestling routines qualifies as humor; it seems to be straightforward absurdist performance art. Based on what Kaufman himself has said, he seems to have been uninterested in drawing within the lines of professional comedy.

Certainly, "humorous" and "funny" are treated in ordinary language as perfect or near-perfect synonyms. So, as much as philosophers are in the business of splitting hairs for analytic purposes, if one wants to offer an analysis of humor that trims it of funniness, I think one needs a good reason, and I'm not seeing one here.

The idea that humor -- and, more specifically, comedy -- occurs as a sort of autonomous activity within the confines of the play frame is central to Gimbel's analysis of the ethics of humor and comedy in Chapters 6 through 8. The play frame isolates and protects the humorist from the messiness of engaging with the real world. The comedian who tells "pure iconic ethnic jokes" -- Polish jokes, blonde jokes, a-priest-a-rabbi-and-a-duck jokes (Gimbel's "ethnic" category is surprisingly broad) -- has gone beyond trading in stereotypes, dealing only with icons: fictional constructs that are too thin to even qualify as stereotypes; they're more like mascots. An icon doesn't refer to anyone in the real world, nor is it filled in enough to qualify as a fictional character; it is "just a human-shaped repository for a thin collection of properties we all know to correlate with the icon" (61). So, the pure humorist can play with these icons in an innocent, non-referring way. Such joking occurs in a "joke-world," an isolated arena from the "real world."

A comedian can breach the barrier between worlds, though, through perlocutionary intent (by trying to make an impact on the real world), or else fissures might develop when a joke refers to an actual person in the real world. However, Gimbel submits, those play-frame barriers that separate the joke world from the real world come in a variety of thicknesses, depending on the context. The play frame surrounding The Daily Show is pretty thin; the play frame surrounding an HBO stand-up special is thicker; the play frame in place in a two-drink-minimum comedy club is quite thick; and the play frame at the Friars Club is "absolutely impenetrable" (150). Whether a joke is able to penetrate the play frame depends on how thick the frame is and how rough the joke is. Gimbel isn't very specific about what determines roughness, but it seems to be a blend of considerateness and delivery. Where the roughness of a joke allows a joke to penetrate the play frame, it becomes morally relevant and may "generate legitimate offense" (150). Where that offense causes actual harm, it may be morally wrong. The comedian carries some responsibility for knowing the thickness of the play frame for the venue in which she's performing, and to have an idea of who might be in the audience, but the audience member has some responsibility as well: "If one is in a comedy club, the social contract provides a very thick play frame. Pay your money, buy your drinks, and hold onto your seat . . . it's going to get rough. If this is not your cup of tea, don't go to a comedy club." (152)

This, it seems, is where things got tricky for Michelle Wolf. Her play frame wasn't nearly as thick as she seemed to think it was (confusing the frame in play at the White House Correspondents' Dinner with the one at the Friars Club), she made constant and pointed references to people and events in the real world (she was clearly not dealing in icons), and her delivery had the roughness one expects on an HBO stand-up special or a truck stop (as Gimbel notes, "use of the word 'fuck' is always rough" (154)). She shattered that play frame.

As I said, the primary asset of Gimbel's book is that it gives us an analytic architecture and linguistic tools for analyzing cases like Wolf's. This is good, but there are problems here as well. If I follow the handy decision chart that Gimbel provides on page 153, I get this result: granting that there is an icon for, say, trans people (as Gimbel's account would appear to suggest), it is okay (morally permissible, acceptable) to tell a transphobic joke if (1) it is a pure joke (just playing with an icon for a laugh, say); (2) the joke isn't delivered in a particularly rough way (if it's delivered lightly and offhandedly, not intended to offend); and (3) no one in the crowd is trans, knows someone who is trans, or is sensitive to the issues trans people face. Likewise, apparently, there is no problem with lightly-delivered racist jokes at a Klan rally. I shall assume that I am not the only one whose hackles will be raised with this outcome.

There are, I think, a couple of issues with Gimbel's account that lead us here. First, his account of immorality seems entirely harm-based. Since no one is actually harmed by the joke, there is no wrong-doing: no harm, no foul. Detailing the problem here would take a great deal more room than the present format allows, but briefly: I think that someone can be wronged even if they are not harmed. The second issue with Gimbel's account lies in the idea of play frames as separating the "joke world" from the "real world." A joke about trans people (or black people, or Poles, or blondes) isn't about unicorns, or jabberwocks, or leprechauns -- things that only exist in fictional domains; it is about people who exist in the real world: trans people, black people, Polish people, or blonde people.

Now, it might be that Gimbel will deny that his theory produces the outcome I suggest, and if so, I suspect he will claim that a transphobic joke is by its nature "rough". But, first, he hasn't really explained what roughness amounts to, so there's at least more work to be done here. And second, the outcome I suggest appears fully in line with what Gimbel says elsewhere in the book. He writes:

All else being equal (that is, if I have no prior reason to believe you harbor biased views), if you tell me an iconic ethnic joke and it is indeed very clever, then the inference I would make is that you are a clever person who tells a good joke and that the joke you told was only a joke. (133)

It seems I'm different from Gimbel in this regard: if someone tells an "iconic ethnic joke" about trans people, I will almost certainly now assume that person is a bigot, regardless of what I previously believed about them, or the venue in which the joke is told. Gimbel seems to believe that "pure" joking occurs in something like Lewis Carroll's Wonderland: a domain of innocent wordplay, but "joke worlds" (whether the world of the HBO special, the comedy club, the Friars Club, or the White House Correspondents' Dinner) are very much in the real world. There are no ethical free-for-all zones. There are no joke worlds.

Gimbel dedicates a substantial portion of Chapter 6 ("Can't You Take a Joke?") to the question of when we can tell "iconic ethnic jokes," leading to this result. But his responses to theories limiting such tellings rely on his assumption of wrong-as-harm (which, as I've said, I find questionable), and his idea of icons (which, given its breadth, is ill-defined, and problematically trades on the idea that jokes about ethnic types are at a remove from the real world). So, Gimbel's book's greatest virtue (beyond how wonderful Chapter 1 is -- again, I can't stress that enough) is that it provides us with analytical architecture and linguistic tools for working with humor and comedy. But architecture can be faulty and tools can be defective, and these may need further refinement before we go relying on them. Gimbel's, I think, risk bringing the house down (see what I did there?).

[1] Wolf’s complete set is available.