Issues in the Philosophy of Religion

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Nicholas Rescher, Issues in the Philosophy of Religion, Ontos, 2007, 117pp., €59.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793701.

Reviewed by Laura Garcia, Boston College


Nicholas Rescher is a philosopher of the first caliber with an impressive list of publications that span the entire field.  He served for many years as Director of the Center for Philosophy of Science at the University of Pittsburgh, and his work ranges over epistemology, metaphysics, social philosophy, value theory, and the history of philosophy.  Religion is one of the few subjects receiving relatively little attention in this vast body of work, with the exception of Rescher's monograph on Pascal's Wager (Notre Dame, 1985).  The present volume of collected essays includes an updated treatment of religion and pragmatism, along with previously published articles on faith and reason, the ontological argument, process theology, Thomism, and the role of God in philosophy.  Three previously unpublished essays explore the boundaries of both science and religion and include Rescher's address to the American Catholic Philosophical Association as the 2007 recipient of that association's Aquinas Medal. 

The opening chapter on "Faith and Belief" sets the theme for the entire collection, introducing Rescher's distinction between a doxastic approach to religion and an axiological approach.  The doxastic perspective focuses on propositional beliefs, their interpretation, coherence, and justification, while an axiological inquiry focuses on what a person values or finds desirable.  Both approaches concern themselves with how God is conceived, but with different ends in mind -- a doxastic inquiry asks what sort of God is being accepted or rejected, while axiology asks whether the existence of God (conceived in a particular way) would be a good or a bad thing, welcome or unwelcome.  Possible doxastic attitudes toward God's existence are theism, atheism, and agnosticism; the parallel axiological attitudes toward God's existence are axiological theism (thinking God's existence to be a good thing), axiological atheism (thinking God's existence to be a bad thing) and axiological agnosticism (indifference toward God's existence).

Most important for Rescher's purposes, a committed doxastic atheist might still be an axiological theist, since it is notoriously difficult to prove something's nonexistence.  Rescher argues in favor of a presumption of atheism vis-à-vis the doxastic question, assuming that in any question of fact the affirmative side is required to offer reasons or evidence.  However, he includes under this description many kinds of evidence -- demonstrative, experiential, inductive, and even acceptance of a claim to revelation.  Rescher spends little time on the doxastic question, moving quickly to his main focus on the value question.  There is no similar presumption in favor of axiological atheism, he claims, since the focus here is not on what is true or false but on what one should wish to be true or false.

Justifying our values is a more difficult task than justifying our beliefs, but Rescher proposes at least two criteria.  First, what one desires should be worthy of being desired.  Many thinkers (Freud among them) point out the fallacy of arguing for the truth of a belief because one desires that it be true.  But a charge of wish-fulfillment can be constructed just as readily against atheism as against theism.  Further, the issue at hand is not whether one has a justified belief, but whether one's hopes and desires are appropriate in one's circumstances.  A second, more empirical criterion asks whether a life guided by a given hope or desire is a fulfilling or satisfying one, by trying to live that way oneself, observing others whose lives are guided by it, or simply imagining what a life guided by this hope would be like.  On this second criterion, Rescher contends that axiological theism is clearly preferable to either axiological atheism or an attitude of indifference toward theism.

The worthiness criterion and the praxis criterion are closely intertwined, since axiological atheism makes sense mainly on the assumption that one has a distorted or inadequate concept of God.  Similarly, a doxastic theist guided by a faulty conception of God might not live a very satisfying or fulfilling life.  Combining the two criteria enables Rescher to ignore many versions of theism, along with the atheism that corresponds to those kinds of theism.  The worthiness criterion requires a very high conception of God, not because only such a being would be worthy of worship, but because only such a being's existence would be desirable.  "The idea of God as a supreme being who loves, sustains and cares about us reflects a supreme embodiment of significant values:  parental solicitude, understanding, loving-kindness."[1]  Further, a person guided by hope in the existence of such a being will be guided by a set of higher, spiritual values, including "a willingness to be challenged to make the best and most of our opportunities for the good in this world, an absence of fear in the face of an inspection of hearts and a preparedness to be held accountable by one who, while well-disposed to us, nevertheless knows us to the very depths of our being."[2]  Considerations like these separate axiological theism from crass imitators such as belief in Santa Claus or the Great Pumpkin.

Assuming that the desire for God is justified, what relevance does this have for belief in the existence of God?  Rescher first notes that belief in God (doxastic theism) normally goes hand in hand with the belief that God is good and worthy of the desires and hopes of humans.  The two attitudes are not logically connected, but their connection seems quite natural and appropriate nonetheless.  Similarly, Rescher claims that axiological theism should lead most persons toward doxastic theism, not as a matter of logic but as a kind of moral imperative.  The assumption here is that the inquirer believes theism is at least possibly true, that it is not definitively ruled out by the evidence available even though it has not been rationally demonstrated (to that person's satisfaction).  In this situation of doxastic uncertainty, Rescher accuses an axiological theist who rejects doxastic theism of succumbing to a failure of nerve or a kind of defeatism, perhaps motivated by the suspicion that theism is too good to be true.  If one cannot imagine a God whose existence would be desirable, Rescher suggests that this betokens a grave failure of imagination or "a regrettable impoverishment of personality of the same general sort."[3]  If such persons suspect that the universe is indifferent rather than friendly toward humankind, Rescher finds them guilty of a jaded and cynical attitude, refusing to "give reality the benefit of doubt on the matter of its containing a God."[4]  Finally, a rational person attempts to put her desires into practice, and "one of the ways we can implement a desire is by letting it guide our beliefs."[5]  Hence an axiological theist who is rational should strive to become a doxastic theist.

While these observations may lead someone in the direction of doxastic theism, they are less successful as attempts to discredit doxastic atheism or agnosticism.  Perhaps everyone who really tries can imagine a Supreme Being whose existence they would welcome, though one might fail in this task for a variety of reasons, including psychological aversion to the idea of a personal presence of such overwhelming power, perhaps based on past experiences of violence or abuse.  Further, while it makes sense to give persons the benefit of the doubt, there is little sense to the idea of giving reality or the universe the benefit of the doubt.  Still less are there grounds for characterizing the hesitant as crabbed in spirit or overly suspicious.

Rescher seems aware of the limitations of the case for doxastic theism so far advanced, since he adds a further argument in the spirit of William James -- accepting as true what one desires to be true is, in some cases, a way of realizing those desires.  One of James' examples is that if Jones believes she can make the leap across a six-foot crevasse, it is more likely she will make it across.  Personal relationships provide further instances where believing one will make friends, interview well for a job, and so on, makes it more likely that one will succeed.  Rescher claims that the case of doxastic theism is similar, so that accepting as true what one wants to be true is a way of putting one's desires into practice.  But surely acting as though theism is true has little bearing on whether or not there is a God.

Perhaps the connection is rather that a person who wants there to be a God might be more likely to find him by acting as though God is there.  Rescher cites with approval Pascal's advice to those who wish to attain faith (doxastic theism) but do not know how:  "Follow the way by which [believers] set out, acting as if they already believed, taking holy water, having masses said, etc.  All this will naturally cause you to believe."[6]  Rescher's observations in this first essay are perhaps best read in conjunction with his autobiographical remarks in the book's last chapter, "In Matters of Religion," where he describes his own religious journey as "long, circuitous, and complex" and claims that "the impetus to religion … eventually comes not from reason but from affects -- from the emotional rather than the intellectual side of life."[7]  While he acknowledges that some arrive at doxastic theism through intellectual considerations, he was never persuaded by the typical arguments in its favor, nor did he come to faith through religious experiences.  Rather, Rescher says he was attracted to theism largely because of the way he felt about various things.  In particular, he was drawn by the importance of the spiritual and moral dimensions of life -- in other words, he was always something of an axiological theist.

Obviously, if there is convincing evidence either for or against God's existence, axiological considerations will (and should?) take a back seat to rational argument.  But in the absence of such evidence, as William James points out, it seems perfectly legitimate to lean toward the more hopeful of the doxastic alternatives.  Withholding belief might be preferable if more or better evidence will be forthcoming, but Rescher follows Pascal and James in thinking that this is unlikely.  Hence, he moved from axiological to doxastic theism along the path he advises, by joining a community of faith and striving to live like one of the faithful.  He came to accept Christian beliefs not just because of his attraction to the ideals they embodied but also by his felt need for a spiritual community.  "Accordingly, the answer to the question of why I am a Catholic is perhaps simply this:  'Because this is where I feel at home.'  It is a matter of communion -- of being in communion with people whose ideas, allegiances, and values are in substantial measure congenial to one's own."[8]  Rescher attributes his choice of religious communities in part to his wife's Catholicism and to other social and cultural factors, and while he clearly believes that much or most of what the Catholic Church teaches is true, he is not especially interested in the task of persuading others of its truth.

The remaining chapters in this collection range from an early (1959) critique of the ontological argument for God's existence, where Rescher sounds like a good Humean, to an enthusiastic endorsement of process theology that incorporates the Hegelian and pragmatist leanings of his more recent work.  As one might expect, Rescher finds process theology more attractive than traditional theism in that, in his view, it more easily accommodates human free will and two-way causal interactions between finite persons and God.  But the real appeal of this metaphysical approach for Rescher might have more to do with his claim that it is consistent with a thorough-going naturalism.  "Naturalism may, in the end, possibly prove to be explanatorily self-contained.  Individually and seriatim, the world's particular phenomena can all presumably be accounted for in terms of nature's own processes, and no super- or supra-natural agency need necessarily be invoked.  But explaining the phenomena of nature and appreciating them in terms of an apprehension of their worth and value are very different things."[9]

While Rescher now seems to have accepted some supernatural elements into his metaphysics, one also detects here a certain nostalgia for naturalism and the presumed omni-competence of the empirical method.  On the other hand, his recent work recommends epistemic humility to naturalists as well as to theists.  The 2007 Aquinas Medal Address to the American Catholic Philosophical Association, "Aquinas and the Principle of Epistemic Disparity," praises St. Thomas for seeing that the gap between human and divine minds means "that we just cannot wrap our minds around the real truth of things -- that the extent and complexity of the real is of a magnitude that outruns our limited powers."[10]  Similarly, a long chapter on "Can a Scientist Be Serious about Religion?" challenges scientifically-minded philosophers to consider the many questions that the scientific method is manifestly unable to address:  what technologies should be developed? why is the world such as to contain rational creatures who can understand its structure and appreciate its beauty? what is the purpose of my own life?  While Rescher allows that there can be clashes between the claims of science and religion, he argues that these will be few and far between and that religious commitment has often provided a strong impetus for scientific research.  The chapter on scientists' relationship to religion addresses several objections to theism commonly heard on college campuses, such as the claim that all the really smart people are scientists who are skeptical about religion, or that an intelligent creator would not use such an inefficient instrument as evolution to bring about the variety of living things in our world.

A couple of closing observations.  First, every Catholic philosopher should read chapters 9 and 10 on Thomism and respect for tradition; Rescher's observations are close to what the late pope John Paul II urged in his encyclical on faith and reason (Fides et ratio).  Finally a brief caveat:  Christian philosophers should be suspicious of the bias toward science that persists even in Rescher's later writings.  His "principle of theistic minimalism" urges believers to prefer a natural to a supernatural explanation of every phenomenon, whenever a natural explanation is possible.  Many traditional arguments for God's existence are thus ruled out of bounds:  "To argue that because the world has certain features various claims about God are warranted is a deeply problematic proceeding."[11]  Rescher treats every appeal to supernatural entities as a truly desperate move, a resort to what he calls crisis philosophy.  However, apart from the effort to appease naturalists, theistic minimalism has little to recommend it.  If there is a God, it is odd to assume that he will be largely superfluous to an explanatory account of creation.

In general, however, Rescher's approach to religious faith and its relationship with science and philosophy is both fascinating and instructive.  This book would make a good text for a graduate course or an upper-level undergraduate seminar in philosophy of religion, and should certainly find a place on the shelves of scholars in the field.

[1] Nicholas Rescher, Issues in the Philosophy of Religion, p. 9.

[2] Ibid.

[3] Ibid, p. 11.

[4] Ibid, p. 10.

[5] Ibid, p. 11.

[6] Ibid, p. 111.  The citation is from Blaise Pascal, Pensees, sec. 233.

[7] Ibid.

[8] Ibid, p. 114.

[9] Ibid, p. 37.

[10] Ibid, p. 86.

[11] Ibid, p. 50.