J. G. Fichte and the Atheism Dispute (1798-1800)

Placeholder book cover

Yolanda Estes (ed.) and Curtis Bowman (ed., tr.), J. G. Fichte and the Atheism Dispute (1798-1800), Ashgate, 2010, 297pp., $124.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780754636885.

Reviewed by Dale E. Snow, Loyola University, Maryland


The atheism dispute (Atheismusstreit) riveted all of learned Germany in 1799, and its consequences reverberated for many more years. The precipitating event seems curiously out of proportion to the response it engendered: Fichte, who was co-editor of the Philosophisches Journal, agreed to print an essay by F. K. Forberg entitled "On the Concept of Religion." Fearing that readers could misunderstand Forberg's ideas as an expression of his views, Fichte included an essay of his own, "On the Ground of Our belief in a Divine World-Governance." As a direct result, the journal was put under an edict of confiscation; Fichte was accused of atheism, officially censured by the authorities, and ultimately resigned from his professorship at the University of Jena.

It was in all likelihood the anonymous publication of a widely circulated pamphlet, "A Father's Letter to his Student Son about Fichte's and Forberg's Atheism," which initially drew public attention to the essays. The editors describe it accurately as "a maudlin tract" (7). It contains a litany of accusations of the ways in which Fichte's and Forberg's ideas were certain to result in corruption of the youth: they stood for atheism, political rebelliousness, and even moral licentiousness. This unfavorable publicity was more than sufficient to touch off a firestorm of criticism of Fichte, his philosophy, and his person. Fichte thought of and presented himself as Kant's heir, and for many Kant's signature achievement had been the overturning of the traditional relationship between faith and reason. This made it plausible to quickly extend the suspicion of atheism to Fichte's best-known work, the Science of Knowledge (Wissenschaftslehre) as well. Numerous publications for and against Fichte appeared in rapid succession, including F. H Jacobi's notorious "open letter to Fichte," which declared Fichte's philosophy to be tantamount to "nihilism." This is thought to be the first use of this term. The larger significance of the atheism dispute, then, can be seen in the way in which it led into a debate over the values of the German Enlightenment itself, much as the pantheism controversy of the 1780s had done.

For both Fichte's contemporaries and today's scholars, the atheism dispute and its aftermath threatened to overshadow all the other achievements of Fichte's Jena period. A recent remark of Allen Wood's is typical of this view: "The 1790s were for Fichte (and modern philosophy) a brief era of astonishing philosophical achievement. But the tale as a whole is far darker and more troubling, even tragic."[1] Daniel Breazeale presents a more measured account in his Fichte: Early Philosophical Writings;[2] however, his book, focused as it is on the Jena Wissenschaftslehre, contains none of the atheism controversy texts. Thus there is a real need for the collection and translation of the relevant materials necessary for the comprehension of this extraordinary episode in the history of philosophy. Even in German, it is difficult to find a readily accessible comparable compilation.[3]

The present volume is a near-masterpiece of careful reconstruction and contextualization of the unfolding of the atheism dispute as reflected in the essays, letters, edicts, and petitions which combine to tell this remarkable story. All of the texts in this volume are appearing in English translation for the first time. The only major atheism controversy text which previously existed in English translation is Jacobi's "open letter" to Fichte.[4]

Estes, one of the editors, observes in the preface that she has sought "to interest the Fichte veteran without intimidating the Fichte beginner" (xiii). To an impressive degree, the book achieves this goal. Although it can profitably be read in chronological order, and the unfolding story makes for fascinating reading, Estes and Bowman have structured the book so that it is possible to consult individual texts in any order one desires and still have the necessary context to understand each one. The eleven chapters each begin with a commentary on a particular text, and the commentaries refer as needed to other chapters as well. This entails a certain amount of repetition, but since it is largely confined to footnotes, it is not obtrusive.

The translation is not just accurate but idiosyncratic in the best sense: it faithfully captures the very different voices of the participants, from Forberg's bombast to K. L. Reinhold's peculiarly emphatic typography and punctuation to the sententiousness of the official ducal pronouncements. Most challenging of all is no doubt the effort to capture Fichte's unmistakable tone, combining as it did self-righteousness, an utter certainty of the truth of his ideas, and a real dedication to the highest and best in man. After the edict mandating the suppression and confiscation of the issue of the Philosophisches Journal containing Fichte and Forberg's essays, Fichte responded by publishing a characteristically spirited document, the "Appeal to the Public," which was subtitled "A Writing One is Requested to Read Before Confiscating." Whereas his original essay had been directed to a philosophical audience, the "Appeal" was intended for a wider public, and Fichte hopes to set the record straight with plain language that does not mince words:

With respect to [my] doctrine of religion, its overarching goal is to snatch away from mankind all the props supporting its laziness and all the reasons for glossing over its depravity, to stop up all the sources of its false consolation, and to leave neither its understanding nor its heart any standpoint other than that of pure duty and belief in the supersensible world (114).

Two other aspects of the translation are noteworthy. Fichte was much given to paraphrasing and summarizing his opponents' views, and the translation helpfully adds quotation marks to indicate passages in which Fichte is not speaking in his own voice. The German text source is cited at the beginning of each text, and the pagination of the original is included in square brackets in the text, greatly facilitating reference.

A still more difficult and therefore even more admirable achievement is to be found in the editors' ability to present a plausible narrative of how the atheism dispute was understood by Fichte himself. An event that seemed to him to originate in a minor and easily dispelled misunderstanding cost Fichte his university appointment and, for a time, his reputation; its aftermath was powerful enough to ultimately alter for the worse the fortunes of the University of Jena itself. As the commentary points out, Fichte's "Juridical Defense" and its passionate description of the necessity of academic freedom for the pursuit of truth eerily accurately predicts the aftermath of his dismissal. Once Fichte had departed, it was not long before "the other luminous faculty dispersed, the spirited students disappeared, and the glorious community that was Jena declined" (219). Yet the commentary on the final text, Fichte's "Concluding Remark by the Editor," written after Fichte had moved to Berlin, concludes on a triumphal note:

If we take Fichte at his word, the atheism dispute represents but a brief early moment in the life of Fichte's continuous Religionslehre, a rough patch in the development of a unified Wissenschaftslehre. Moreover, the atheism dispute does not signify Fichte's utmost failure, but as he often described it, his supreme test (275).

Fichte may have had to wait more than two centuries for a truly sympathetic and nuanced presentation of the atheism controversy, but he has received it at last.

I have but one quibble, and it is not with the book but rather its index, which is neither comprehensive nor complete. Given the large number of figures who make an appearance during the atheism controversy, and the complexity of the events, this is regrettable. Some omissions are minor, such as a passing reference to Virgil's Aeneid (165n), or the first mention of Karl Friedrich Bahrdt (99). However, references to Johann Gottfried Dyck, the writer and publisher who famously wondered how Fichte could have the audacity to hold that the Wissenschaftslehre was true, appear on pp. 146, 246n, and 265; yet this audacious fellow does not appear in the index. More worrisome is the omission of some references to Goethe, certainly a key figure in the atheism dispute. His behind-the-scenes role in the decision of the Weimar court is discussed in the commentary to Chapter 8, with particular reference to the conflict between his enlightened principles and his political views, as illustrated by his own practice of supporting a mistress yet recommending to the duke that he execute a woman accused of infanticide (210-211). The index does not indicate that Goethe is referred to on these pages.

[1] Attempt at a Critique of all Revelation, Allen Wood (ed.), Garrett Green (tr.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010, x.

[2] Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1988, pp. 40-46.

[3] Klaus-Michael Kodalle and Martin Ohst's Fichte's Entlassung. Der Atheismusstreit vor 200 Jahren (Würzburg: Konighausen & Neumann, 2000) is out of print, as is Hans Lindau's Die Schriften zu J. G. Fichte's Atheismus-streit (Munich: G. Müller, 1913).

[4] The Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel Allwill, George Di Giovanni (tr.) (McGill-Queen's Studies in the History of Ideas) McGill University Press, 2009.