J. M. Coetzee and Ethics: Philosophical Perspectives on Literature

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Anton Leist and Peter Singer (eds.), J. M. Coetzee and Ethics: Philosophical Perspectives on Literature, Columbia University Press, 2010, 408pp., $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231148412.

Reviewed by Eileen John, University of Warwick


This volume offers a series of philosophically focused discussions of the work of J. M. Coetzee. The essays address the ethical, meta-ethical, and moral-psychological substance that his novels engage with, and a number of them discuss how the literary mode is relevant to that engagement. The latter project contends with the unsettling experience that philosopher-readers may have, of wondering how well their own practices and goals hold up in relation to conceptions of the human situation that emerge in Coetzee's work. Does Coetzee "pull the carpet from under [our] feet as philosophers" (5)? In Conrad's Lord Jim, it is said of a man who testifies to his own disgrace that "The sound of his own truthful statements confirmed his deliberate opinion that speech was of no use to him any longer." This evokes the gaping worry -- to what avail is truthfulness? -- within the "paradoxical truth seeking" that the editors identify in Coetzee, and it could pull the rug out from under philosophers and novelists alike. Although philosophy, especially in its less self-aware, more complacent forms, comes in for pretty hard knocks in relation to Coetzee, his works explore vulnerabilities that are shared across philosophy and literature.

 Whether or not ethics and philosophy of literature are one's professional concerns, this is a book one can turn to simply as a reader of Coetzee who wants deeper reflection on his work and on truth seeking for relatively non-professional purposes. I found the volume to be interesting and worthwhile on all fronts. Even the essays that struck me as to some extent wrongheaded or not persuasive pursue excellent questions, and the volume overall has a clear, accessible style of address. It is somewhat difficult to absorb as a whole -- not surprising in an edited volume with seventeen different approaches to Coetzee -- so it would make sense to prioritize essays discussing works of Coetzee that have particularly gripped you.

Several essays present Coetzee, his works, or his characters as promoting specific ethical positions: on individual responsibility for government-sponsored torture (Lear and McMahan), on treatment of animals (Dawn and Singer, Aaltola), and on "politically correct" but morally empty practices (van Heerden). Some of these essays explicitly set aside the literary context in which Coetzee typically works, and might be charged with avoiding complexities raised by that context, and many readers will not be so interested in establishing the ethical views of Coetzee the person. But to the extent that Coetzee or his works have been criticized for being ethically "hands-off" or evasive, I found these essays to be useful. I take one of the achievements of the novels to be that they carry a sturdy ethical burden -- e.g., in van Heerden's terms, the need for kindness and respect for human and other animals, and for states and laws that support "the emergence of good people" (60) -- in the midst of disorienting probing of what ethical demands rest on and of what it takes to be moved by those demands. Assuming the ethically sturdy impact is there, I would have liked to see someone engage more directly with how the novels pull that off while also having a philosophically disorienting or de-stabilizing impact.

One route into the disorienting and probing impact, and into the significance of the literary mode, is via the claims made by one of Coetzee's prominent characters, Elizabeth Costello, who is herself a novelist by profession. She speaks for the ethical centrality of opening our hearts and using sympathetic imagination to think our way into the being of another. Costello casts this sympathetic openness as allied, plausibly enough, with poetry and the imaginative work of fiction, rather than with the discursive reasoning of philosophy. Contributors to the volume take these claims in many directions, illustrating Coetzee's intense and complex questioning of sympathy, reason, and ethical life. Crary finds in Coetzee's work an exploration of a wider conception of rationality, in which emotional sensitivity is needed to reach a "just and accurate grasp" of our lives, and which can include literary speech in an "inventory of rational discursive forms" (265). Woessner finds rather an inventory of protagonists exposing the inability of rationality "to help us live our lives," the cumulative result being a "post- or even pre-philosophical ethics of compassion," critiquing reason "for the sake of moral life" (225-6, 223). Meanwhile, Geiger argues that in Coetzee's work the power of sympathetic imagination emerges as ethically equivocal: "we are as likely to be inhabited by good as by evil" (162). He also does not think Coetzee allows a clear distinction between poetic and philosophical language to be drawn -- "For what alternative is there to the language of comparison and the abstraction of universals?" (151).

Several essays challenge or complicate the idea of entering into the being of another, and the further idea that doing so could be the central and most effective ethical requirement. If ethical demands emerge in relation to others whose being is inaccessible to us in some important sense (perhaps the case with nonhuman animals), then Costello's imperative to open ourselves to others will be inadequate. Vice's essay focuses on the letter-writing character in Age of Iron who asks her daughter not to read the letter with sympathy. Vice sees the novel developing a conception of ethical demands as not requiring "knowledge of the individual but an acceptance of the unknowable" (297). Vermeulen takes Coetzee ultimately to undermine Costello's claims by insisting on the ethical demand to acknowledge bodily suffering, where this acknowledgement not only is not ensured by sympathetic imagining but also involves facing the limits of imagination (284). Dvorakova, too, makes awareness of bodies central: "Understanding others in the sense of sharing their being is less about thinking oneself into them and more about moving in close proximity . . . feeling the pressure of their bodily presence" (376).

In the essays by Lamey and by Leist that most directly take issue with Coetzee, though in each case with hesitation and qualification, the move toward sympathy and away from reason is scrutinized: what is this move linked to in Coetzee and where may it lead? Lamey sets up the ethics of sympathy as responding powerfully to gaps in social contract forms of ethical theory, but argues that Coetzee also entwines this theme with a quite different account of our closeness to others. He foregrounds Coetzee's interest in René Girard's views of society as resting on mimicry of others' desires and the production of scapegoats, animal and human, to relieve the violence of shared and competitive desire. Here again we can see Coetzee probing the ethically equivocal potential of sharing the being of another. Leist focuses on what he calls the "archaic ethics" that surfaces as an apparently live option, in the critique of obsessively rationalizing and divisive social structures, with the character Michael K perhaps most fully manifesting the turn to a "precultural, prelinguistic, animal-like state" (218). Leist, who categorizes Coetzee as an "experimental postmodernist," thinks the force of Coetzee's work is in fact constructively pragmatic rather than archaic, whether or not Coetzee intends to disown the archaic option.

There is no obvious "winner" here in the thicket of readings and arguments. This seems appropriate. As Flynn notes, the point of the literary work is not to elicit "the" interpretation; the philosophical role of the literary form may lie in its power to elicit different modes of reflection, rather than particular substantive claims (320, 324). The idea that we learn something about ethical or moral thinking itself, and the nature and difficulty of ethical belief -- rather than learning what to believe -- are themes running through the book. Deckard and Palm develop this theme in relation to the novelist's particular difficulty with belief, Costello again serving as the speaker who makes provocative claims: "'In my work a belief is a resistance, an obstacle'" (350, quoting from Elizabeth Costello). I found Deckard and Palm's appeal to "romantic irony," to describe Coetzee's own distancing practices, helpful. The romantic ironist imposes a distance between belief and expression of attitudes not for purposes of "self-concealment" but in order to look at his or her attitudes from new angles, for "a more honest self-awareness" (343). These themes also show up in the portraits of "extreme loneliness" that Pippin discusses, with Pippin emphasizing, in Hegelian terms, that Coetzee's lonely, disintegrating characters need reciprocal relation to other selves. Achieving self-awareness, and understanding of ethical failure and obligation, is not an asocial project.

It is thus somehow cheering that Coetzee himself is here linked in a lively way to such a host of interlocutors: e.g., Hegel (mostly as an ally), Rorty (in sympathy and not), Midgely (also in different ways), Nietzsche, Nussbaum, Kierkegaard, Girard, and Hume, along with literary traditions of sentimental and epistolary fiction and the satirizing of philosophy. The result is not, of course, that the reader now knows how to approach Coetzee in philosophical terms. But there is a good conversation ongoing here, and as a complex, intellectually expansive collection, the book does not oversimplify the literary-philosophical relation.