J. S. Mill's Political Thought: A Bicentennial Reassessment

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Nadia Urbinati and Alex Zakaras (eds.), J. S. Mill's Political Thought: A Bicentennial Reassessment, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 392pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521677561.

Reviewed by Glyn Morgan, Harvard University


This excellent collection of essays focuses on John Stuart Mill the politician, public intellectual, and political theorist.  The editors' point of departure is that two hundred years after Mill's birth his political thought "remains pertinent to our own political life" (2).  This is a bold claim.  Mill inhabited a very different political world from ours.  His principal political preoccupations -- female suffrage, the education of the working classes, the moral improvement of the nation's culture, and the government of dependent colonies -- are quite alien from ours.  Furthermore, many of his intellectual assumptions and methodological tools now seem hopelessly inadequate.  Measured against our own theories, Mill's "stadial" sociological theory seems half-baked; his associationist psychological theory crude; and his pre-marginal economic theory obsolete.

Yet the editors want to show us that Mill is more relevant today than at any time in the recent past.  Mill, they claim, can assist us in formulating responses to problems posed by the resurgence of nationalism, foreign intervention, and the consolidation of democracy in non-western societies.  Surprisingly, the essays in this volume go a long way to vindicating the editors' claims.  Mill emerges from these essays as a thinker who is more attuned to the real world of politics, more keenly aware of the interaction of ideas and institutions, and more realistic about the constraints of culture and history, than many contemporary political philosophers.

The book kicks off with a dazzling piece by Jeremy Waldron, who examines Mill's testimony in 1871 to the Royal Commission reviewing the Contagious Diseases Acts.  Mill's testimony to the Commission is interesting, if only because one might have assumed that he would have approved of these laws.  Their aim was to regulate prostitution in naval towns, in an effort to cut the incidence of sexual disease amongst the armed forces.  Viewed in this light, the laws, as Waldron notes, would appear quite consistent with the approach to legislation that Mill defends in On Liberty.  Yet Mill opposes these laws.  Like many feminists, he objects to the way that they target women, who face, if they are suspected of prostitution, an invasive physical examination.  Whatever "harm" prevention the laws might achieve, they do not justify treating women in this invidious fashion.  "I do not consider [the legislation] justifiable on principle," Mill argues, "because it appears to be opposed to one of the greatest principles of legislation, the security of personal liberty" (16).

Faced with Mill's puzzling hostility to the Contagious Diseases Acts, Waldron considers three possibilities: (i) Mill changed his mind subsequent to writing On Liberty; (ii) Mill is here balancing harms -- the "harm" of forcing various women to undergo a physical examination against the "harm" of sexually-diseased sailors; and (iii) Mill objects to the unfair distribution of liberty that results from these Acts.  Waldron tries to show that Mill ultimately relies on an argument from the distribution of liberty.  On this reading, Mill's political theory contains a proto-version of current arguments employed by constitutional lawyers to criticize the discriminatory impact of legislation on specific groups of citizens.  If Waldron is right, then Mill's political theory is certainly more pertinent to contemporary political debates than we might have thought.

The apparent tensions between Mill's activities as a political actor and a political theorist lead Dennis Thompson to pose the question: when is it justified for a politician of principle to accept or reject a compromise?  Mill, as Thompson points out, was one of the few great political thinkers to have had a career, if a very brief one, as a politician.  Mill was elected as a Member of Parliament for Westminster in 1865 and was voted out of office, much to his disappointment, a mere three years later.  Like Waldron, Thompson is struck by some of the positions that Mill the politician adopts that seem hard to square with Mill the political theorist.  Mill's zealous prosecution of Governor Eyre is a case in point.  Eyre's brutal suppression of the Jamaican rebellion earned him the censure of many liberal politicians.  Mill, however, was unwilling to settle for any form of censure short of criminal prosecution.  Mill's failure to compromise on this point -- even in the face of evidence suggesting that the effort to prosecute Eyre would jeopardize the agreement on a lesser form of censure -- was a factor in Mill's electoral defeat in 1868.  Thompson notes here how Mill refused to consider the narrower political consequences of his efforts, even to the point of damning others in his party for acting from expediency, and fixating solely on the importance of upholding "the principle of government by law."

In a suggestive coda to his essay, Thompson gathers together some precepts concerning the permissibility of politicians compromising their principles.  It's not clear, however, that this is an issue about which one can formulate a generalizable theory.  Whether a compromise is justified surely depends on the relative likelihood of realizing, what might be termed, "principled gains" as opposed to "compromised gains."  Ex post we can assess the compromise; ex ante we cannot easily predict the likelihood of achieving different possible outcomes.  In this respect, a politician always labors in various degrees of darkness.  Nonetheless, Thompson's discussion of this issue is both original and thought-provoking.  And again his essay demonstrates the continuing relevance of Mill's political positions.

A number of contributors rest their case for Mill's enduring relevance on his keen awareness of the forms of domination present in modern society.  There is a paradox here, however, because -- in contrast to most contemporary liberals -- Mill allows that "despotism" can sometimes be a legitimate form of government.  Nadia Urbinati explores this tension in her illuminating essay.  She shows how Mill differentiates between tyranny and despotism, and how he extends his critique of domination into areas where liberals even today do not like to peer.  One of Mill's most insightful critiques of domination can be seen in his various essays on the subjection of women, which Maria Morales discusses in her excellent essay.  Morales -- building upon her own important book on Mill's political thought -- argues, against the grain of scholarly convention, that "many of Mill's feminist concerns are dominance concerns that cannot be reduced to difference concerns" (47).  She demonstrates this point by focusing on Mill's condemnations of domestic violence.  Morales shows that Mill possesses a sophisticated understanding of the social pressure on women to present themselves as weak, dominated, and inferior "as an essential part of sexual attractiveness" (49).  On this view, Mill is strikingly more modern -- even post-modern -- in his understanding of the mechanisms of domination than generally recognized.

While Morales is very sympathetic to Mill's critique of sexual domination, it might still be asked whether Mill actually appreciates human sexuality.  When Mill writes about sexuality, he typically reduces it to an "animal" function or instinct.  (This language crops up, for instance, in Mill's intervention on the Contagious Diseases Acts that Waldron discusses.)  Nowhere in his work does he link sexuality to his own conception of romantic individuality; nowhere does he show even an inkling of the mysterious pleasures of human sexuality.  Perhaps his critique of sexual domination goes through regardless of his priggish views of sex.  But perhaps not.  Anyone who wishes to pursue this question further will find Morales' splendid essay a good place to start.

Bruce Baum also explores Mill's theory of domination, although in the economic rather than the sexual sphere.  In his penetrating essay, Baum contends that Mill's "political economy of freedom" is consistent with a form of liberal socialism.  Baum's essay raises the question whether individuals would have greater freedom (i.e. experience less domination) in a socialist or a capitalist economy.  Part of the difficulty in answering this question is that "freedom," however it is conceptualized, is hard to measure.  We simply don't know what particular variant of welfare capitalism or market socialism is likely to maximize freedom.  It is also worth remembering that for Mill "happiness" not freedom (although they are closely linked) is the ultimate value.  To assess Mill's institutional recommendations -- whether in favor of liberal socialism or anything else -- we need to come to terms with his developmental conception of happiness.

This developmental conception plays an especially important role in Mill's argument for representative democracy.  Given that Mill believes that only a "noble character" can experience full happiness, it might seem that he would have preferred an oligarchy of the well-educated rather than a liberal representative democracy.  Jonathan Riley's very clever essay explains why Mill rejects the oligarchic option.  Riley recognizes that for Mill no one, no matter how individually advanced, can experience full happiness outside a society of equals.  Unless society educates all individuals up to a certain developmental level, then no one can achieve genuine happiness.  Wendy Donner's essay generalizes this point to give a comprehensive account of the role that education plays in Mill's moral and political theory.  Like Riley, she emphasizes the extent to which representative democracy for Mill involves a process of education.  In some respects, Donner's essay is the most useful in the entire collection, because it gives a very clear account of Mill's conception of happiness and the theory of life in which it is embedded.

In his own very astute essay, Alex Zakaras notes some internal tensions in Mill's argument for democracy.  At one level, Mill worries about the consequences of tyranny of the majority; and yet at another level, he emphasizes the educative function of participatory democracy.  On Zakaras's interpretation, the Millian account of "individuality" is not merely an expression of a higher form of happiness, but a presupposition of Mill's own argument for participatory democracy.  The individual's capacity to reflect and modify his or her character and worldview in the context of rational debate -- "reflective self-disruption" as Zakaras puts it -- is essential, if democracy is to escape the dangers of majority tyranny and mass conformity.  This interpretation does, however, presuppose that "individuality" is something other than a minority trait.  Certainly, there is something attractive in Zakaras's description of "reflective self-disruption," but it's not clear that contemporary citizens -- many of them blindly devoted to ethnicity, religion, and tradition -- would be able or willing to embrace this practice.

A final group of essays in the collection focuses on Mill's views of nationality, foreign intervention, and empire.  These writings are remarkably timely.  Like Mill, we struggle with the decision whether it is ever morally acceptable and pragmatically sensible to intervene militarily in the affairs of foreign states.  Like Mill, we must decide how much national integration is necessary and desirable in a democratic society.  And like Mill, we must formulate policies towards failed and backward states.  Frederick Rosen and Alan Ryan both draw our attention to the theory of progress that plays such a significant role in Mill's approach to these topics.  Rosen traces Mill's distinctive "method of reform" back to his two very important essays on "Bentham" and "Coleridge" and his social scientific theory outlined in Book VI of the Logic.  For Rosen, Mill was more of a "Coleridgean" than many recent scholars have recognized.  Through Coleridge's influence, Mill rejected the deductive social scientific methodology of James Mill (and contemporary rational choice theorists), in favor of a social theory that allowed him to identify (or so he thought) the stages of social progress and the necessary components of social cohesion.  Mill tried to ground this social theory in a new socio-psychological science of human character formation (or "ethology").  Mill had a lot more confidence in this social theory than seems warranted, not least because he failed to confront a number of crucial ambiguities in the theory.  Alan Ryan's very insightful essay identifies one such ambiguity: is progress convergent or divergent?

This is not a theoretical question that preoccupies contemporary moral and political philosophers.  Nor is it a question that contemporary social scientists think much about.  Yet this question requires some answers if the advanced industrial western states are to act coherently in their dealings with the many failed states and backward societies in the world today.  Four of the essays in the volume show that we have much to learn, both negatively and positively, from Mill's writings on international affairs.  The negative lessons are drawn by Karuna Mantena in her wonderfully synoptic and intelligent essay on Mill's "Imperial Predicament."  While Mantena is not so dismissive of Mill's approach to empire as some recent commentators, she points to some familiar failings, most of which can be traced back to his sociological theory of progress.  More positive lessons are drawn by Georges Varouxakis, who comes to a spirited defense of Mill's theory of nationality; Stephen Holmes, who mines Mill's Considerations on Representative Government for lessons on the practicality of military intervention for democratic purposes; and Michael Walzer, who offers a new re-reading of Mill's A Few Notes on Intervention.

The Holmes and Walzer essays are especially important, because they bring into focus some important differences between the Millian approach to foreign policy and contemporary liberal approaches.  Again the key point of difference lies in Mill's reliance upon a theory of progress.  For Mill, unlike for his father and most liberals today, liberal democracy is not a form of government suitable for all societies.  Walzer, who would prefer to drop Mill's theory of progress, believes that Mill would "be heartened" (356) by the efforts of Amnesty International and others to spread freedom as a universal human right.  But I'm not sure this is true.  Mill is, as Holmes' very helpful essay notes, scathing about the naivete of those philosophical radicals who believe that democracy would be "a fit form of government for Bedouins and Malays" (321).  Mill believes that state-building and nation-building are necessary steps on the road to liberal democracy.  To this end, he not only allows but encourages despotism.  There is an element of "realism" here that most contemporary liberals would run away from.  But if Iraq has shown us anything, it's the futility of trying to plant democracy in a society fractured by ethno-religious divisions.  It's not obvious that Amnesty International activists have anything useful to contribute to solving those divisions.  Mill's despotic solution -- even in the shape of a Saddam Hussein -- is probably the only option for securing relative stability in such a divided society.  Clearly Mill would only support an improving despot -- and it's doubtful that Saddam would qualify as such -- but he prefers any despot to a Hobbesian state of nature.

It is worth asking, by way of conclusion, whether Mill's confidence in his own principles and foreign policy prescriptions is warranted.  This point takes us back to that question posed in Alan Ryan's essay: is progress convergent or divergent?  There is both a normative and a sociological dimension to this question.  Normatively, Mill clearly thinks of liberal democracy as a common and convergent telos of human development.  Only in a free and democratic society could all individuals have a reasonable chance of achieving happiness.  It is difficult to understand how any contemporary liberal could dissent from this position, even if there remains room for disagreement on the precise nature of this happiness and its normative authority.  Sociologically, matters are more complicated.  Mill does not think that there is any necessary reason why societies will actually follow the normative path he identifies.  Stagnation and regression are always possible.  Nonetheless, he appears to know what stages (and in what order) societies must pass through on the road to liberal democracy.  Yet Mill's own sociological theory -- his failed science of character formation -- does not seem to allow Mill to identify these stages.  How does he know, for instance, what effect despotism has on the character of people so ruled?

Few contemporary liberals would profess Mill's level of sociological confidence.  In fact, contemporary liberal theory rarely bothers with a sociological theory at all.  Which is better?  An inadequate sociological theory grounded, as Mill's was, on a poorly worked out science of character-formation?  Or no sociological theory at all?  Contemporary liberals certainly pay a high price for the latter, not least because they remain vulnerable to all the criticisms that Mill himself leveled at Bentham and the philosophical radicals.  But it's not clear what form a more empirically-grounded liberal theory might assume.  Anyone who wishes to pursue this question will find the essays collected here a very useful point of departure.  No doubt, this is a book that belongs on the shelf of every student of Mill's social and political theory.