Jacques and Raïssa Maritain: Beggars for Heaven

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Jean-Luc Barré, Jacques and Raïssa Maritain: Beggars for Heaven, tr. Bernard E. Doering, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 528pp, $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 026802183X.

Reviewed by William Sweet, St. Francis Xavier University


Jacques Maritain remains, for many, something of an enigma. Early identified with the most conservative forces in France, he would later be accused (by the Dominican, Réginald Garrigou-Lagrange) of being indulgent towards communism. He described himself as a Thomist, though many Thomists had -- and have today -- deep suspicions about much of what he wrote. He inspired Catholic thinkers around the world, but left a legacy that is arguably more secular than religious, and more practical than philosophical. He was perhaps the best-known and most admired Catholic philosopher of the mid-twentieth century, and yet many have questions about his life that scarcely seem resolved. And Raïssa, Jacques's wife and intellectual and spiritual partner, is perhaps even more of an enigma.

Jean-Luc Barré's book is an important contribution to understanding Jacques and Raïssa Maritain, and it has been rightly recognized as providing insights into the life and character of a couple who, for a time, seemed to have their finger on the pulse of intellectual life and culture in mid-twentieth century western Europe and the Americas. Soon after its original publication in French in 1995, it was recognized with a series of awards, such as the Prix de la biographie de l'Académie française. Bernard Doering makes Barré's work accessible to a wide audience by providing a generally accessible, fluid, and readable translation.

Yet those who look to Barré's book for insights into Jacques's philosophy or into the philosophical exchanges of the period in which he was involved, will likely be disappointed.

The greatest virtue of Barré's book is his ability to bring to life something of the early life and times of Jacques and Raïssa Maritain -- particularly of a youth that Jacques Maritain himself seemed to prefer to leave largely shrouded (since apparently Maritain's complete correspondence is still not open to scholars [p. 45, see p. 16]). Barré delves deep into these years -- of Jacques, who was the product of a home rooted in the secularism and the bourgeois character of late nineteenth century France, and of Raïssa, a young Jewish emigré from Russia. Barré draws extensively on books, letters and manuscripts from both Jacques and Raïssa's families, as well as documents found only in the Maritain archives in Kolbsheim (France), with the aim of providing a greater depth in coming to see who Jacques and Raïssa were. It is commonly held that the key element to understanding Jacques is to look at his relationship with Raïssa -- and here this translation is the most thorough of the biographies available in English to date. (N. Possenti Ghiglia's still untranslated I tre Maritain (Milan, 2000) provides a very rich account of the family life, putting into clearer focus the role of Raïssa's sister Vera, who lived with the Maritains from December 1906 -- soon after their marriage in 1904 -- until her death in December 1959.)

Barré raises some of the key -- and frequently unanswered -- questions concerning Jacques's life. What was the nature of the intellectual relationship between Jacques and Raïssa, particularly in the years after their conversion? Why and how far was Jacques involved with the right-wing l'Action française -- and why did he remain so close to it for some fifteen years (1911-1926), before its condemnation by Pope Pius XI? Was Jacques ultimately a man of conservative renewal, or was he a political progressive, offering a positive alternative to capitalism and socialism?

The Maritains' life was obviously filled with encounters and ideas. At Versailles and, later, at Meudon -- but also in the United States -- the Maritain household welcomed many of the artistic, literary, and cultural leaders of the time. Barré introduces the reader to some of the more interesting figures -- Léon Bloy, Charles Péguy, Georges Bernanos, Jean Cocteau, Julien Green and, of course, Charles Maurras, head of l'Action française. The story of Bernanos (and Jacques's "correction" of the manuscript of Sous le soleil de Satan) does not do Jacques much credit (pp. 232-5). The account of l'affaire Maurras is thorough, and Barré goes some way to explain what Maritain himself never did -- i.e., exactly what it was about the ideas of l'Action française that were close to Maritain's own. (This issue has been entered into at further length, after the initial publication of Barré's book, by Philippe Chenaux, in Entre Maurras et Maritain -- Une génération intellectuelle catholique (1920-1930) (Paris: Cerf, 1999).)

While there are limits to this biography, it makes a genuine effort to present Raïssa clearly, and to show her role in Jacques's life. It is a biography of Jacques and Raïssa -- the sub-subtitle of the French text is "biographies croisées" -- lives that not merely intersect but interweave. It was Raïssa who introduced Jacques to the works of Aquinas, and she was also involved in Jacques's early "anti-Bergson" writings (see p. 126). But once we leave the salon at Meudon, she -- like her sister Vera -- gradually fades from view, and the interesting question of the extent of her intellectual contributions to Jacques's accounts of art and, later, of political humanism, is left unanswered.

We do learn much about Jacques -- we learn of his very early, polemical, writing. We see him as a mentor, and Barré refers to Jacques as a "franc tireur" (a sniper) (p. 17) and an "insurgé" ("an insurgent") (p. 31) -- and regularly as a "desperado" (the term is translated by the same English word, although this doesn't seem to capture what Barré meant by the term). Barré's portrayal of Maritain as a "secret agent" constructing "himself in haste during the whole course of his life" (p. 96) is an interesting and provocative insight. Thus, rather than see Jacques as a convert and fellow traveler of Maurras who awakens more fully to Christian humanism, we are moved to look at him as a passionate radical who, despite an affiliation with the antidemocratic l'Action française, returns to the humanistic values of his youth.

Barré's account, however, proceeds very slowly. By the time that the reader is three-quarters of the way through the book, we are only in 1938, and the Maritains have yet to leave France, and to install themselves in the United States where, for much of the next two decades, Jacques was to write his mature -- and his most influential -- philosophical work.

We also miss much. The magic of Meudon -- what exactly attracted so many into the Maritain circle, even though many were to pass through it -- remains elusive. We miss a serious treatment of Jacques the philosopher. Jacques obviously attracted those who were to make real contributions to philosophy, but why and how remain unclear. We know that Jacques first established himself in his polemical and vigorous attack on bergsonisme, but was this an attack that had any purchase except in Catholic philosophical circles, and was there any substance to many of Maritain's charges? Why did Maritain undertake what was certainly his philosophical magnum opus, The Degrees of Knowledge? What issues brought him to this? What was he struggling with? What exactly was he trying to respond to? And how far was Jacques a philosophical force to be reckoned with in France in the 1930s? Were his philosophical views even then on the margins, so that the move to North America turned out to be (to put it bluntly) a good move for Maritain's philosophy and influence? These are not particularly abstruse questions, and they would serve to help the reader better understand the man.

Even Jacques's place within the Catholic philosophical traditions is unclear. One might have expected that, as a leading French Catholic philosopher of the 1920s and 1930s, he would have been welcomed in Québec in the 1930s or, later, during his exile from France during the second world war. But the charged reaction of the philosophers of the Université Laval to Maritain's work on the common good does not merit discussion. Jacques first came to North America to teach at St Michael's College of the (English-language) University of Toronto -- largely on the invitation of Etienne Gilson. But the relations between Gilson and Maritain were (surprisingly) not particularly close. Again no mention is given of this, or why. Maritain's association with Garrigou-Lagrange (who was later a Vichy sympathizer) is mentioned, and the uneasy nature of their relationship is recognized, but one is left to wonder whether there was any philosophical difference between them or whether, in the end, their disagreements were principally a matter of politics.

Maritain spent over a decade after the war (1948-60) at Princeton. Yet, as Barré reminds us, American philosophers -- even at his own university -- were largely indifferent to Maritain's work, his courses were offered outside of the Philosophy Department, and Maritain's classes were small. It is, of course, true that Maritain was a welcome visitor at universities such as Chicago and Notre Dame, but it is certainly worth asking why there was not more of an exchange between Maritain and the principal figures of the American philosophical establishment. Was it Maritain's Catholicism? Was it the growing hegemony of analytic and continental schools in the United States? Or was a reluctance on Maritain's part to engage contemporary currents seriously and thoughtfully? Readers will search in vain for Barré's view on this.

Ironically, perhaps, Jacques's legacy was not his epistemology, or his aesthetics, or his "Christian philosophy" (p. 302). He is perhaps best remembered in philosophical circles for his arguments for natural rights -- a defense that arguably influenced the Universal Declaration of Human Rights of 1948. (The final pages of Maritain's Les droits de l'homme et la loi naturelle of 1942, and the articles of the UDHR are remarkably close.) Yet here, too, the reader is given little insight into Maritain's role in the discussion, how his writings may have influenced key figures such as John Peters Humphreys or Charles Malik, or even why Maritain came to such a way of articulating his humanist views.

Doering's translation is clear and fluid, and he has rightly sought to give a fluid, rather than a strictly literal, translation of Barré's idiom. But there are moments where it seems that "franglais" has crept into the translation -- for example, using "actuality" instead of "contemporary character" for "actualité" (p. 293), and "deception" instead of "disappointment" for "déception" (p. 338). There are also several typos (including a few important dates), though none, I think, will lead to any misunderstanding of Barré's text.

Those who know little of Jacques and Raïssa Maritain will learn much from this book; those interested in the arts and letters in France between the wars will learn much as well. But the philosopher or historian of philosophy will likely come away with only a little. Barré's book will help one to understand something of the person and personality of Jacques and Raïssa, and some of the key questions will have gone some way to being answered. But readers must still wait for a more complete philosophical account.