Jacques Derrida: A Biography

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Jason Powell, Jacques Derrida: A Biography, Continuum Press, 2006, 250pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826490026.
Hamline Universit

Reviewed by Nancy J. Holland, Hamline University


Jason Powell presents his biography of French philosopher Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) as "a comprehensive continuous narrative of Derrida's life, an appraisal of his works and a summary of his philosophy" (p. ix).  While understandably preliminary as an account of Derrida's life, the book is much more successful on the other two points, providing a strong overview of the work and placing it in a framework that illuminates the development of Derrida's thought over the forty years of his career.

In accord with Powell's plan, the book moves from family history through Derrida's apparently turbulent boyhood and his hard-won success at L'école normale supérieure, to the birth of deconstruction, and his later fame, offering in one volume information and insights gleaned from earlier writings by Derrida and others that address more narrow aspects of his life.  Powell breaks his account into periods:  "Algeria", "Paris and the ENS", and so on.  Within each chapter, if more clearly at the outset, biographical and theoretical materials are divided into separate sub-sections, e.g., "Boarding School" followed by "Husserl".  There are entire chapters on major works such as Glas, The Post Card, and The Politics of Friendship, and sub-sections on other important writings, e.g., Of Grammatology, Of Spirit, and Spectres of Marx.  Each of these offers both summaries and analyses of writings that place them in a clear context of the work as a whole.  There are also extended and helpful discussions of the work of Derrida's sources (especially Marx, Nietzsche, Heidegger), teachers (especially Althusser) and contemporaries (Levinas, Foucault, De Man) that again provide a useful context for understanding Derrida's work.

The contextualized summaries of Derrida's major works are generally quite good and should prove useful for those who have not yet read the whole corpus, even if one might want to quibble about Powell's judgments of which works merit detailed discussion.  His readings of the works are also generally good, occasionally brilliant, as his remark that "It is possible to see Derrida as the historian of philosophy, the one who tells its story from a new angle, from the perspective of justice and injustice" (p. 97).  Other judgments are more doubtful:  "Perhaps deconstruction is a genuine accommodation and resolution of the otherwise insoluble problems between the 'West' and the 'rest'" (p. 35).  In any case, Powell clearly has a strong grasp not only of Derrida's work, but also of that of his colleagues in the philosophical innovations of the 1970s and 80s, and the historical figures from which they primarily drew.

As to the biography itself, the information about Derrida's youth is especially useful and enlightening for those unfamiliar with the earlier, less complete accounts.  The emphasis on his early years, however, means that we learn much more about Derrida's ancestry and the two brothers who died as children than about his wife and sons.  Moreover, the picture drawn of the young Derrida as both a hooligan and totally absorbed in literature -- "He dreamt of a great explosive Book and whiled away time by belonging to a gang" (p. 18) -- calls for much more fleshing out.  There is, perhaps, a tendency to put too much faith in Derrida's own account of his youth, but Powell is very clear about the limitations of his sources (for example, that he had no access to Derrida's letters [p. 6]).

This problem is related to a more pervasive, if fully understandable, difficulty with the book as a whole.  Powell, like many philosophers, has not developed the ability to write a narrative, although his story does move us from an unknown Algerian boy to the familiar man he became.  The lack of literary elegance is in unfortunate contrast to Derrida's own writing.  Powell reminds us that Robert Bernasconi says that "the part that storytelling plays in Derrida's work is [its] chief literary quality" (p. 40).  Illustrative of the lack of narrative quality is the way Derrida's friendship with Louis Althusser is handled.  A sentence telling us little more than that Althusser "suffered from psychiatric problems" (p. 30) could be redeemed only by an irony that is not evident here.  Only much later (p. 186) do we learn that for many years Derrida was the only person permitted to visit Althusser at the institution where he was incarcerated after murdering his wife, a fact that clearly calls for more comment, if not more explanation.   It is perhaps to play to his own strengths as an interpreter of Derrida's work that, after Derrida's marriage and the birth of his two sons, Powell largely abandons the life, except for occasionally tedious lists of Derrida's travels, for the works.

Another reviewer might comment that the biography is perhaps a bit too laudatory, honest about the man and critical of certain aspects of his work, but hardly critical of the man himself.  Indeed, Powell defends Derrida at some length against the attacks that appeared in The Times in 1992 and The New York Review of Books in 1993, as well as against critics such as John Searle and Roger Scruton, and accusations that he was "the French Heidegger."  Powell's admiration for Derrida is almost palpable and, for those like myself who share it, one of the more pleasurable elements of the book.

At the same time, there are a few major gaps in his discussion of the development of Derrida's thought and its reception in both literary theory and philosophy.  Perhaps the most startling, given its prominence at several points in Derrida's work, is the absence of any discussion of the relationship between gender and philosophy, or of the feminist response to Derrida's work.  (Neither "feminism", "gender", nor "women" appear in the book's index.)  There are, at best, passing references to Derrida's collaboration with women philosophers and theorists, and no extended discussion of the feminists with whom he was most closely associated, such as Sarah Kofman and Hélène Cixous.  This narrowing of perspective sometimes has negative effects on the author's evaluation of Derrida's argument, as when he asserts that the rejection of writing in "Plato's Pharmacy" is "a tacit prejudice" or a "judgement without grounds" (p. 50) when one could argue that such grounds do exist and are quite clearly linked to gender.  Similarly, in discussing Politics of Friendship, the author comments only that "On the whole Derrida only makes open-ended suggestions, about what destabilizing effects the woman makes in this equation…" (p. 200) and then moves immediately back to the (male) friend with no indication of the central role gender plays in the argument there.

There is a similar, if less marked, weakness in the account of both analytic philosophy in the U. S. context and the American reception of Derrida.  One wonders, for instance, about the statement that philosophy in America "has the role of legitimating the US government and the scientific enterprise" leading to the suggestions that analytic philosophy "has as its telos the establishment of a universal culture for a static, totalitarian universal civilization" (pp. 124-125).  Intriguing, and possibly even largely justified, but surely in need of much more argument.  Similarly, Powell largely overlooks the fact that, while in the early years most (never all) of those interested in Derrida's work came from departments of language and literature, by the mid-1990's, at the latest, he was an established figure among American philosophers working in the European tradition.  Many of these philosophers, such as Bernasconi and John Caputo, are in fact frequently cited here.  On the other hand, Powell is quite good at noting the difference in publication dates of various works in France, the U. S. and Britain, and its effects on how Derrida was understood.

Surely more, perhaps too many more, biographies of Derrida will be written, but all biographical legacies have to begin somewhere.  Powell's aim is clearly to be that somewhere for Derrida, with full awareness that to begin is not yet to arrive.  I recommend this book to anyone starting a study of Derrida, those who know some but not all of his work and would like to gain an overview of it, or serious students of deconstruction and its history.  It is not yet a book for someone interested in coming to know Derrida the man as he was in his prime and later, or for those hoping for the "story" of his life.  To read it is to come to know the works better, or to see them in a different light, but Powell continues the pattern Derrida himself set in the early years when he refused to be photographed so that the focus would be on his work, not the man.  Powell's decision to say less about the life, to which we do not otherwise have access, and more about the works, to which we do, may be necessary at this time, but for all that the choice is still, like the photograph of Derrida on the book's cover, somewhat sad.