Jacques Rancière: An Introduction

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Joseph J. Tanke, Jacques Rancière: An Introduction, Continuum, 2011, 189pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441152084.

Reviewed by Giuseppina Mecchia, University of Pittsburgh


In the last decade, the works of Jacques Rancière have become widely influential in a wide array of disciplines. From political philosophy to aesthetics, from literary criticism to film studies, Rancière's concepts and insights have started to shape the insights of an increasing number of scholars across different countries. As often happens for continental philosophy, translations have played a key role in insuring Rancière's presence on the shelves of Anglophone philosophers and cultural critics. It is therefore not surprising that at the end of a decade that saw almost the entirety of Rancière's considerable output translated into English, we should finally have an introductory monograph to the thought of this most remarkable French thinker. After the appearance of several volumes of essays dedicated to Rancière's thought, Joseph Tanke is in fact the first scholar who has come forward with an original and comprehensive study entirely devoted to it. As a former contributor to two anthologies devoted to Rancière's philosophy, I was reminded of the superiority of the single-authored monograph almost immediately upon opening Tanke's remarkable study. It is in fact only through a global engagement with the main issues presented in a philosopher's universe that an original perspective can be developed, a difficult feat that Tanke nonetheless is able to accomplish very successfully at different levels.

Tanke rightly identifies the notion of "the distribution of the sensible" as the nexus between the different texts composing Rancière's corpus.  As Tanke says, this expression is used both to identify what, at a certain period in history, can come to perception and in which hierarchical position within a larger field of appearance, and what can be equally shared in the creation of a common aesthetic scene. In other words, "the sensible" -- as the realm of appearance and perception -- is both already there and always open to new configurations. It is in the creation of the "new", in fact, that aesthetics and politics merge. For Rancière, every new configuration of the realm of appearances is in fact strictly dependent on the political reconfigurations forced on social institutions by the people in their affirmation of absolute equality. Tanke organizes his discussion of the struggle for equality in the realm of appearances, as told by Jacques Rancière, in five chapters. The first four are devoted to the position that the Rancière occupies within the history of philosophy, political theory, aesthetics, and film studies. The last chapter is a welcome questioning of some of Rancière's assumptions. I will come back to this, as this friendly critique is in fact one of the most interesting aspects of the book and engages in a much needed philosophical dialogue with a thinker that up to now had not been approached from a broad and comprehensive perspective.

The discussion of Rancière's position in the history of philosophy is perhaps the closest to my own interests, and Tanke frames it most appropriately by a few fundamental questions:

Can philosophy enter into meaningful dialogue with the arts and political practice, or is it irredeemably marred by the space and time of its production? . . . Does its refusal to think the site of its own production prevent it from entering into collaboration with other arts and practices . . . ? Are its procedures fundamentally inimical to equality, and are they themselves reliant upon its repudiation? (7).

Anyone familiar with Rancière's writings, especially with Althusser's Lesson, Philosophy and Its Poor and Dis-agreement, will recognize the importance of this issue. Rancière tells us time and again that since the Greek polis, the Western philosopher has always kept close to the institutions close to political and hierarchical power, often aspiring either to the role either of enlightened reformer or of pedagogue to the sovereign. Even Marxism -- present in Rancière's polemics mostly through the figure of Louis Althusser, his one-time master at Paris' Ecole Normale -- is not exempt from this critique, since for Althusser the people need the mediation of a 'truth bearer' external and more elevated, be it a single intellectual or an institution, such as the educational system or the Party.

Nothing is more foreign to Rancière's commitment to the equality of minds and souls that resides at the core of his understanding of humanity. As Tanke reminds us, it is by reading the archives of the French workers' publications in the nineteenth century that Rancière came to a clear and irrevocable truth: nobody, not even the philosopher, knows more about politics and aesthetics than anyone else. It is by entering full force in the definition of contemporary "distributions of the sensible" that the working class asserts its absolute intellectual and aesthetic equality with the ruling classes. As far as philosophy still believes itself to be a privileged place of knowledge and understanding, Rancière is indeed critical of it. However, Tanke is right in saying that Rancière's thought is still dependent on "powers of formalization", as it tries to extract abstract principles, such as "the sensible" or "equality", and to critique their historical becoming. This is an important insight, as it rightly distances Rancière from any suspicion of nihilism and relativism. Philosophy identifies "the parameters delimiting what can appear to the senses, the logic carrying them forward" (41), and in this respect occupies a distinctive position alongside the arts and political discourse.

As chapter 2 explains, the egalitarian, democratic impulse that we already saw at play in Rancière's critique of philosophy represents the very basis of his political thought. Tanke immediately underscores how Rancière redefines the very concept of politics, detaching it from issues of power distribution and apportionment. For Rancière, the institutions assigned to that role are in fact part of the policing of the 'have nots' by the 'haves' and are always profoundly anti-democratic. The demos is in fact what needs to be silenced in this kind of political arrangement. The only truly political instances are to be found in the irruptions of the demos on the public scene, in spite of the assigned role that it had been given by more or less democratic forms of policing. Tanke rightly says that Rancière's political thought has found its most complete and original expression in Dis-agreement, an essential reference that anyone interested in the critique of Western democracies should explore in depth.

Tanke also offers some essential examples of the impact that Rancière's definition of equality has on actual political practices: if it is true that "equality . . . is an irreducible fact of social existence, which, try as they may, the proponents of inequality can never entirely efface" (56), then no nihilist 'end of politics' can ever be declared. The people will, in unpredictable ways, always find a way to "demonstrate" their equality with their rulers, and Rancière is keen on individuating the many historical occurrences of these "demonstrations".

Politics as intervention in the sphere of the partition of the visible is also, in fact, at the core of Rancière's aesthetics and film theory, which Tanke examines in chapters 3 and 4. Rancière, in fact, wants to describe the spaces "where art can discover a capacity for dissensus".(74). Those spaces were most clearly defined in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, under what Rancière calls 'the aesthetic regime of art', but as Tanke rightly says, no artistic 'regime' completely dominates an era. Traces of the 'ethical' (Platonic) and the 'representative' (Aristotelian) forms of artistic expression, both analyzed as operating in a social and cultural paradigm tied to the 'Old Regimes' of Western societies, are to be found across the centuries. In this respect, Tanke's reading of Rancière closely connects him with Michel Foucault, whose approach to different epistemes is in fact quite similar.

The fact remains that Rancière is a powerful theorist of modernity, since for him what happens in the aesthetic regime is the end of the strict partitioning of artistic subjects and artistic forms typical of the ethical and representative regimes. While in 'classical' artistic forms both the work of art and its public were strictly predisposed according to rules of creation and distribution, in what Rancière calls "the aesthetic regime" and we might want to define as 'modernity', art becomes a "means of subjectivation that allows the spectators to contest the estimation of their capacities", offering them a "counterworldly experience" (87) acquiring a deep political and ethical meaning. Tanke's account of this mechanism is exemplary. The fact that cinema has increasingly been at the center of Rancière's preoccupations is therefore not surprising: cinema is in fact a place of constant struggle between the representational and the aesthetic regimes of art, as they play against each other in a constant game of ordering and disruption. This dichotomy, far from being reductionist, redefines issues of cinematic history, providing a powerful conceptualization of the aesthetic underpinnings of this expressive form.

As I said at the beginning, Tanke's last chapter is t where he enters more directly into dialogue with Rancière. Tanke articulates his intervention around notions of freedom and imagination. Why, he asks, "should aesthetic experiences be understood in terms of equality, rather than, as they were by thinkers such as Kant, Schiller, Schelling and Hegel, instances of human freedom?" (143) Tanke points out that far from preaching the equality of all, the Romantic thinkers who lived in the era dominated by the "aesthetic" regime of art were often extremely tied to potentially exclusionary notions, such as genius. One could object to Tanke's critique that this is precisely the reason why Rancière sticks with the works of art themselves, and not their theorists. Too close to philosophy's essential complicity with structures of power, the German philosophers quoted by Tanke did not recognize the expression of equality that was at the basis of contemporary artistic forms, such as the novel and Romantic poetry. A corollary of this counterargument would be that Tanke never recognizes Rancière's roots in French history, and more specifically his understanding of the French Revolution as a watershed in the history of equality. Similarly, the fact that Rancière does not make use of the Kantian notion of 'imagination', which Tanke considers to be an implicit and underexplored notion in Rancière's political and aesthetic theory, could be seen in a different light. For Rancière, it is in language as faculty and a daily practice that the possibility of politics and aesthetic resides. Closer in this to Mallarmé's materialism than to Schiller's idealism, Rancière's theory does not intrinsically need a theory of the imagination in order to hold its ground. In this respect, I find Tanke's conclusions extremely worthwhile and articulate, but not necessarily compelling.

Tanke's book will be an essential reference for anyone interested in Rancière's extraordinarily rich philosophical contributions. Written from the standpoint of a strong and articulate philosophical voice, this first monograph is in fact not only an introduction, but a true and original engagement with one of the most far-reaching among contemporary continental philosophers.