Jane Austen's Emma: Philosophical Perspectives

Placeholder book cover

E.M. Dadlez (ed.), Jane Austen's Emma: Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2018, 246pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190689421.

Reviewed by Valerie Wainwright, University of Florence


E. M. Dadlez writes in the introduction to this collection of eight commissioned essays that their authors' engagement with Jane Austen's Emma is "philosophical in a variety of ways" (p. 7). These writers certainly relate Austen's novel to philosophical theories or concepts for a variety of reasons. Peter Knox-Shaw argues that Austen participates in debates to which David Hume and Francis Hutcheson made significant contributions. Hume reappears when Peter Kivy discusses the issue of potential reader responses, and invokes the idea of "reader resistance." Christine Korsgaard's notion of what it means to be an autonomous person provides Eileen John with her point of departure. Most contributors suggest that certain philosophical concepts seem to resonate with themes in the novel. Heidi Silcox and Mark Silcox explore the functions of "gossip," proposing connections with the thought of Heidegger; while Richard Eldridge finds the ideas of Gilbert Ryle and Richard Wollheim useful in highlighting the problematic nature of self-understanding. In the essays of Neera K. Badhwar and Dadlez and of Cynthia Freeland, aspects of Aristotle's thought function as a framing device for discussions of the heroine's character -- a subject of extensive debate amongst literary critics to which in these chapters scarce or no attention is paid.

Yet the restricted focus and/or limited range of reference is disconcerting, as thoroughness of scholarship is plainly one of two essential desiderata given the aims of this volume. We might expect that an essay with pretensions to interdisciplinarity, that seeks to appeal to "literary scholars of various kinds" and "to further thought and work" (x), would engage with strong arguments originating in the domain of Austen studies when these are relevant to a thesis. But the smattering of citations and sparse notice of works of literary criticism in half of these essays show that these authors are uninterested in debating with literary critics. Then there is the matter of critical engagement with a text. To rephrase Rafe McGregor (Kafka's The Trial, Philosophical Perspectives Notre Dame Philosophical Review, 2018:06:05), scholars who want to be taken seriously will do more than provide a new reading, whether their perspectives are philosophical or not. When exploring an author's interests or concerns (and in this case their philosophical relevance), it clearly pays to pay attention to the evidence the text itself has to offer, taking into account those narrative features that appear to establish an ideological point of view or that complicate the identification of a reliable or dominant narrative stance with respect to a novel's system of beliefs and values. As Robert Clark has remarked, "the highest criticism [whatever its orientation] is of course syncretic," integrating form and content;[1] and attending to those rhetorical devices and strategies that organize experience, to aspects of form that (in its various intricate modes) serve to shape theme or articulate an argument: it is perhaps the surest way of coming to understand Austen's way of thinking about the reality that her novel projects. Bringing into their discussions of philosophical ideas and problems those textual elements that serve to elucidate and buttress their interpretations, Eldridge, Davis, Silcox and Silcox, and Knox-Shaw provide illuminating readings of this novel. Before addressing these studies, I will note some problems with the arguments in other chapters.

In her introduction, Dadlez reflects briefly on the relations between philosophical and ethical concerns and literature, and surveys the contents of each chapter. She discusses some of the preoccupations voiced by Kivy in "The Dilemma of Emma: Substance, Style, and Story," though no mention is made of Reginald Farrer's responses to many of these objections in his study of 1817 ("Jane Austen. Ob. July 18, 1917," reprinted in Jane Austen's Emma: A Casebook, Fiona Stafford ed. Oxford University Press, 2007, pp. 57-82). Kivy expresses his opinions on an array of subjects, offering little in the way of reasoned exposition. He touches upon Austen's place in the canon, style, and especially, Emma's failure to provide "a whopping good story"; unlike Dickens, Austen fails, Kivy declares, to give us characters of sufficient psychological depth. I will address only Kivy's remarks on the 'Condition of Women' problem. Plainly, women do lack the job opportunities of men in life and in literature, but authors will incorporate those elements of their worlds that have a bearing on the themes they are investigating. And some major themes evidently elude readers who fail to grasp the thematic richness of the novel, and who cannot see beyond marriages or morality. In Emma -- as elsewhere in Austen's fiction -- Austen traces the many ways in which women exercise power and influence in the home and the community. History proves that women could be brilliantly effective, strong, and influential (for good or bad), and important, and Austen shows this too.

Kivy is troubled by the novel's putative system of values -- by the "perceived immorality in the world of Emma" (p. 236) -- and ill-equipped, labors over a well-trodden and labyrinthine terrain. Whether Austen is a subversive or conservative writer is a question that has long been at the centre of debate amongst literary critics who have combined the themes of morality and history. But Kivy has nothing to say about the seminal studies of, for example, Marilyn Butler (Jane Austen and the War of Ideas Clarendon Press, 1975) or Claudia L. Johnson (Jane Austen: Women, Politics and the Novel University of Chicago Press, 1988).

John begins her essay ("Emma and Defective Action") by asking, "what can we learn about defective action from Emma?" And her methodology becomes immediately apparent when she raises the issue of Harriet's lack of autonomy only to admit that this is a non-starter, for it leaves out "what seems to be the more central question of the novel: What is wrong with Emma's action?" (p. 85). Essentially what we are given here is not so much an argument, but more a work in progress, consisting of the author's thoughts and speculations on the problem of how to conceptualize "defective action" and its contrary "ideal action," and on the question of how to understand "an Austen-style ideal of agency". Continually switching back and forth between these objectives, John claims that the novel's ideal may be conceived either as a form of autonomy or maturity, before opting for maturity. She tries out a number of models that might function as a kind of benchmark for moral agency, ideas that are "not obviously repudiated by the novel" (p. 95), and the reader is taken down a number of blind alleys in the process: a procedure that may be requisite in a philosophical paper but is unprofitable in this context. John tackles the novel armed with her sizable repertoire of concepts, but the disjunctive approach to the narrative that is a correlation of their deployment obscures any sense of the narrative arc, and makes it difficult to recognize the constituent parts of a theme or argument.

John claims that, "the ideal of autonomous, rationally principled action just is not the ideal that Austen finds relevant to her portrayal of human social life" (p. 93). The difficulty here concerns John's focus on this version of rational action. So while this concept is unhelpful, John fails to consider whether another idea of what constitutes rational behavior might be relevant. Examining crucial phases in the representations of Emma's states of mind at critical junctures supplies an alternative perspective; and one whose plausibility derives precisely from its grounding in the text's own discourses. One challenge -- concerning Knightley -- is particularly significant, as I have argued elsewhere.[2] Austen portrays Emma as a person who is able to abide by a Lockean conception of rationality "standing still," as it were, "suspending" a (most pressing) desire, recognizing what matters to her, reasoning upon "probabilities," choosing, and then acting in accordance with a new desire (Emma [hereafter, E]. 401-2). [3] As Antonia LoLordo has argued,

Locke's is the sort of full-fledged free agency that derives from having the capacity to suspend the prosecution of one's most pressing desires and deliberate about the best course of action. This opens up the possibility of determining oneself through reason, which is essential to the self, rather than allowing oneself to be determined by one's surroundings. (Locke's Moral Man, Oxford University Press, 2012, p. 63)

In "Emma's Pensive meditations," Freeland endeavors to apply Aristotelian ideas to Austen's novel, joining a long list of writers whose contributions are not acknowledged here, and her argument develops in a critical void. She takes a quaintly judgmental line: "Emma is not all bad, and she is worth our time," but she needs "to grow into virtue". According to Freeland, Emma is provoked by Knightley's scolding into feeling shame, which is apparently "internalized" (p. 68). That Emma often feels mortified is indisputable; and shame plays its part in motivating her act of kindness to Miss Bates the day after the Box Hill fiasco, an act which signals an unmistakeable change in attitude. However, if we are to be persuaded that shame is a causal factor in self-improvement, and that Emma has indeed undergone a more substantial transformation than a change of attitude implies, we require an account of the narrative's mechanics of this process rather than speculation as to "what seems likely" to have happened (p. 71). An alternative reading would focus on the mental states characterized by vain hopes, relapses and regrets, as well as the seemingly irrepressible positive emotional responses of the extravert that significantly modify the painful sensations of shame: "natural cheerfulness" is of "powerful operation," and "will be sure to open to sensations of softened pain and brighter hope," notes the narrator (E. 130, emphasis added). Such a comment foregrounds the vital effect of a personality trait: a propensity like cheerfulness is not -- as Austen makes clear -- some kind of fancy accessory to a solid core of virtues and vices, of little explanatory value, but, as I have argued elsewhere, it is frequently an important, even prime, factor in shaping conduct -- as well as central to literary realism's requirement of "life-likeness".[4]

The title of Badhwar and Dadlez's essay "Love and Friendship: Achieving Happiness in Jane Austen's Emma," is comprehensive, but the explanatory framework is again restrictive, the salience of the novel's scheme of concepts is discounted, and aspects of the argument are weak. Emma supports many of Aristotle's ideas of friendship and virtue, they contend: Emma is "virtuous enough to count as virtuous overall," and thus deserving of "virtue friendships," which embrace mutual moral improvement, and hence are the best friendships (p. 25). On this view, Austen is committed to a conception of character that foregrounds the virtues; these enable you to engage in relationships that allow you to become the best version of yourself, which is an even more virtuous person. Similar readings have been proposed before though they are not mentioned here.[5] It is, in any case, a view that generates problems of interpretation. A plausible challenge to this reading would focus on the novel's take on Emma's moral psychology as well as its perspectives on character desirability. Emma is virtuous, it is claimed, insofar as she is "disposed to keep trying to reach the truth about important matters" (p. 41). However, talk of virtue seems beside the point when we focus on Austen's subtle depiction of the mind's resourcefulness as it pursues a potential escape from the even greater pain that is the likely outcome of truth (E. 215).

Knightley and Emma are moral equals, Badhwar and Dadlez argue, and certainly they are both good-natured, but no attention is paid to Wayne Booth's influential argument that Knightley rightly assumes the role of wise mentor (The Rhetoric of Fiction, University of Chicago Press, 1983, p. 253). The point is that Knightley's opinions, desires and experience constitute one of the novel's major perspectives vis-à-vis the question of what makes for a good relationship. Significantly, the traditional virtues do not feature finally in his account of what he finds compelling. Rather his discourse highlights the desirability of a personality trait (see comment in review of Freeland above): the "openness" of "temper," or propensity for self-expression, that facilitates a stimulating verbal contest or the delightful speaking of minds (E. 267-268, 445). Knightley is eventually enlightened by the "brilliancy" of Emma's image (E. 405); the moment when he relinquishes the desire that she might "become better". It is a conversion that signals the narrative's subordination of the didactic to the comedic principle with its celebration of the qualities of wit, intelligence and energy -- or "agreeableness" (E. 405 n.1).

Further, the novel's perspective on friendship becomes clearer when Emma reflects on character desirability, and comes to appreciate the importance of (Jane Fairfax's) "elegance" or gentility: "elegance, which, whether of person or of mind she saw so little of in Highbury. There . . . was distinction and merit" (E.157). Historical context matters: Emma belongs to the world of the social and economic elite whose core values include gentility: a status marker or, more precisely according to Emma, a model of "distinction and merit" that is constituted by the alignment of "Birth, abilities, and education" (E. 394). A cultivated mind just is what an enlightened mind looks for in a friend.

Paying close attention to the novel's rhetoric and schemes of exposition, David Davies ("Misreading Emma") investigates the issue of the reader's competence or capacity to make the most of the novel's dramatic ironies. In a rigorously sustained argument Davies shows that -- contrary to critics who maintain that she deliberately mystifies her reader -- Austen enables an acute interpreter to pick up the clues that Emma misses and hence enjoy the experience of Emma's "culpable" misinterpretations.

Three essays are richly contextualized, deftly drawing upon philosophical ideas as well as those of other lines of enquiry to investigate and underscore significant aspects of the novel. Skilfully argued, they are nuanced and fascinating.

Knox-Shaw ("The Reconstrual of Imagination and Romance") argues that Austen "sets out to imagine the unconscious and everyday work of the imagination with all the conscious deliberation appropriate to a central theme" (p. 162). This intricate analysis reveals the ways in which Austen shows that "the imagination is basic to the growth of relationships", while exposing "the many hazards of the process, and reminding her readers of their own susceptibility to misreading" (p. 169). In a profound exploration of the novel's modes of argumentation and characterization, Knox-Shaw also reveals Austen's concern with "the heuristic processes" that some characters are able to employ as a corrective to false judgment (p. 180).

Silcox and Silcox ("The Many Faces of Gossip in Emma") examine Emma from the perspective of the ambivalent nature of "gossip," and note its function in helping Emma to change her attitude to Jane Fairfax. Here "gossip" features as a catchall category comprising various forms of verbal exchange, including disputation, and even Knightley's judgment delivered at Box Hill (p. 145); though we note that the text transmutes a conversation into a monologue, as Emma is struck dumb by Knightley's disquisition. Whatever significance we may want to attach to Knightley's power to silence the heroine, the authors are surely right when they suggest that "the novel's portrayal of how relationships and motivations are transformed through talk reveals a sensitivity both to the moral dangers of gossip and to what recent evolutionary psychologists have identified as its fundamental role in the regulation of human societies" (p. 135).

Eldridge's aim in "'A Danger at Present Unperceived': Self-Understanding, Imagination, Emotion, and Social Stance in Emma" is to identify the flaws in Emma's attempts to achieve greater self-understanding. Pace Freeland, he observes that "it is not quite clear either how Emma changes or how much her errors are persistent" (p. 110). Eldridge surveys the theories of Ryle, Quassim Cassam, and Wollheim, and extracts those clues that further our understanding of "the phenomenology, texture, or psychodynamics" of Emma's troubling self-appraisals. Emma's are misreadings that take shape in response to a vital need to protect a valuable self-image, a "crystallized image of herself as benevolent, imaginative, perceptive and effective" (p. 126). In comparison to Philosophy's search for "standing terms of assessment," Austen can show, Eldridge suggests, "the complexity, temporality, partiality, and elusiveness of self-understanding". It's a comment that perfectly captures the subtlety of Austen's moral psychology.

[1] Robert Clark, "Introduction: Closing (with) Jane Austen," Robert Clark, ed. New Casebooks, Sense and Sensibility and Pride and Prejudice (Macmillan, 1994), 7.

[2] Valerie Wainwright, "Jane Austen's Challenges, or the Powers of Character and the Understanding," Philosophy and Literature 38 (2014), 69.

[3] Quotations from the novel refer to Jane Austen, Emma, Fiona Stafford, ed. (Penguin, 2003).

[4] Valerie Wainwright, "Emma's Extravagance: Jane Austen and the Character-Situation Debate," in Fictional Characters, Real People: The Search for the Ethical Content of Literature, Garry Hagberg, ed. (Oxford University Press, 2016), 102-126; and idem,"On being Tough-minded: Sense and Sensibility and the Moral Psychology of 'Helping'", Philosophy and Literature 39: 1A (2015), A195-A211.

[5] See, for example, Sarah Elmsley, Jane Austen's Philosophy of the Virtues (Macmillan, 2005).