Jean-Luc Nancy: Justice, Legality and World

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Benjamin Hutchens (ed.), Jean-Luc Nancy: Justice, Legality and World, Continuum, 2012, 229pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441123787.


Reviewed by Marie-Eve Morin, University of Alberta


Among the various collections of essays on Jean-Luc Nancy's work that have recently been published, this volume distinguishes itself by its focus on questions of justice and law. Certainly, as far as the incommensurability of justice or the groundlessness of law are concerned, Derrida's name comes to mind more readily than Nancy's. One could point to at least two reasons for the relative neglect of questions of justice and law in Nancy's work. The first is the somewhat elliptical nature of his remarks on justice, or on the imperative that arises out of his ontology, and the difficulty of sketching out concretely what such an imperative ("to create a world") would entail. The second is the more or less complete absence, in the secondary literature, of discussions of Nancy's reworking of the Kantian categorical imperative.

Nancy's engagement with Kant's ethics is, aside from a chapter in The Experience of Freedom, most pronounced in his 1983 work L'impératif catégorique, whose essays have been translated into English in various books such as A Finite Thinking and Birth to Presence. We might speculate that such a dispersion of the subject matter has prevented the recognition of the important role that the problematic of imperative and law plays in Nancy's work. The present volume seeks to remedy both of these lacunae. And while it is certainly successful in doing so -- especially with Christopher Watkin's and Ian James's essays in Part One, and Francois Raffoul's essay in Part Two -- it is the third and longest part of the book, dedicated to recent and more familiar themes in Nancy's work -- world, globalization, politics, democracy, communism -- that in my eyes makes this collection especially worthwhile.

The first section of the book, "Justice, Incommensurability and Being," starts with an essay by Nancy titled "From the Imperative to Law." The editor does not mention that this text is a longer version (the last two sections on droit have been added) of the Preface to the Italian translation of L'impératif catégorique, which appeared in French in Le portique in 2006. In this preface Nancy develops anew the question that occupied him in the earlier work, that is, the imperative or obligation that being or existence consists in. This short essay does shed light on the passage from existence as being-obligated (Existenz as Zu-sein, as Heidegger would say) to the imperative to create a world. Nancy justifies the shift from one to the other by making "the category" (or the complete table of categories) that which the categorical proposition commands (12). What must be then is "the totality of determined existences, in the community of their relations," or in other words, "the world of reason" or "reason as world" (13). The difficulty lies in understanding this command not as the demand to bring about a certain ideal order (turning the one who is commanded into a demiurge or a Subject) but as the demand to stand in the opening that the world is. Nancy reiterates here a theme familiar to his readers: neither the world nor the human are given, and hence neither freedom nor human rights are given, be it as fact or as ideal to be accomplished. Understanding the kind of presence that freedom and rights have (neither present nor absent, neither real nor ideal) is what is at stake in Nancy's "non-metaphysical" ontology.

The next essay in this section, by Watkin, nicely sets the stage for a discussion of the normative force of Nancy's ontology. If a specific politics is derived from and justified in terms of what is, then such a politics "easily arrogates to itself the right to dispense Ultimate Justice on the basis of an ultimate and inflexible ontological justification" (19). To prevent such totalizing violence, thinkers such as Derrida and Levinas insist on the incommensurability of justice, a justice that always remains to come, absolutely open to the radically other. Watkin explains in what sense Nancy's ontology is an ethos and how this ethos informs his notion of justice (which, as he rightly points out, is different than saying that there is in his work a transition from ontology to ethics, and from ethics to politics). Ultimately, by distinguishing incommensurability according to the "with" from incommensurability according to the Other, Watkin is able to show how Nancy's notion of justice does not lead to either paralysis or messianic hope.

James's essay picks up on the themes of incommensurability and measure. Justice is linked to justesse, that is, to the exactitude of the measure. Yet, that to which justice is owed, that which must be measured justly, is finite and worldly existence, which is, for Nancy, lacking in common measure. According to James, it is the role of ontological discourse to take the "just measure" of what is. While James thinks this is the case also for Derrida (and for Badiou), the specifically spatial, corporeal, and sensuous register of Nancy's ontology leads him to frame justice in terms of bodily presentation or compearance and the "just clarity" that renders bodies visible (40), rather than in terms of the messianic temporality of decision. At the same time, the justness of an ontological discourse that takes the measure of ontological incommensurability will lie not in its doctrinal content, as James points out, but in its ability to expose the excess of being at the limit of discursivity. Hence, ontological thinking is tied to a certain aesthetic or discursive practice.

The next essay picks up on the aesthetic dimension of justice and asks whether philosophy can do justice to art, since art concerns the particular and the distinctive. If art is essentially fragmentary, it cannot obey any laws that would gather it into some sort of unity. The law of art is the law of multiplicity. Martta Heikkilä shows how the law of tact (to touch without touching, to interrupt touch so as not to appropriate the thing itself) and the abandonment of being (that there is being, here and now) in Nancy "contribute to the thought of the inappropriable and irreducible fragmentation of art" (48). At the same time, she argues that art, rather than conforming to and being explained by the dual law of tact/abandonment, adds a new law to existence: the finite law of perpetual multiplication and diversity (58).

The second section of the book is subtitled "Legality and Language." It is somewhat puzzling to see Raffoul's essay in this section, since his contribution focuses on the ontological bearing of the categorical imperative for Nancy. Raffoul develops Nancy's notion of being as being-abandoned, which was also discussed in Heikkilä's essay, in relation to Heidegger and Sartre in a careful and thorough way, and proceeds to show how this being-abandoned is a being-obligated, doing so in a way that sheds light on Nancy's opening essay. Indeed, Raffoul's essay should be read in tandem with Nancy's text.

The next essay, by Gilbert Leung, takes up the question of legality and language more directly and brings Nancy's work into discussion with legal philosophy. Leung presents various assessments of legal fiction throughout the history of legal theory and shows, with the help of Nancy, how the law is founded upon nothing, so that legal fiction is our only legal reality. Law is fiction, or juris-diction is juris-fiction, not in the sense that it is a "crude falsehood, deception or expediency" (93), but in that it always responds to a case (a casus, an accident) in a creative or free way. While it is interesting to explain how Nancy comes to this conclusion, it is unclear to me precisely what would distinguish this line of thought from what Derrida called, following Pascal, the "mystical foundation of authority."

The next essay, "Nancy Contra Rawls," by B.C. Hutchens, considers the ways in which Nancy might respond to central tenets of Rawls's conception of justice, such as the original position, the veil of ignorance, or the maximin rule. While Hutchens is certainly right in his extrapolation of what Nancy "might object to" (100) or "would find interesting" (104) in Rawls, the stakes of the confrontation between the two is not explicit. Why should a reader of Nancy care about Rawls? Or maybe the point is that readers of Rawls should take Nancy seriously. But two problems arise here. First, the Nancian objections to Rawls concern their respective conceptions of spatiality and historicity, as well as autonomy, freedom and rationality, and essentially these objections boil down to a fundamental disagreement about the construal of ethical subjectivity itself. Given the absence of common ground, it is hard to see how a fruitful dialogue can emerge. Rather, it seems that a Rawlsian who would take Nancy's objections seriously would end up having to completely change her way of thinking about subjectivity. Second, even if one shows the possibility and importance of a dialogue between Rawls and Nancy, I do not think that Hutchens has articulated Nancy's position with all the clarity necessary for it to be understood, let alone be taken seriously, by readers of Rawls.

James Gilbert-Walsh's essay proposes to read Nancy's work along the lines of an "acknowledgment" and show how such a gesture is prefigured in Augustine's Confessions. What Nancy does philosophically and what he exhorts us to do takes the form of an acknowledgement, more precisely an acknowledgement of our own origin, an origin that is essentially bound up with Christianity. Such an acknowledgement works, according to Gilbert-Walsh, in three steps: 1) the attempt to determine what is encountered by seeking its ground; 2) the realization that the ground of what presents itself cannot be presented directly but only through interruption; and 3) the transformation of the "pointing-out" into an indebted, active responding to what addresses us. While the first two steps are Heideggerian, the third, for Gilbert-Walsh, is not. This certainly sheds an interesting light on Nancy's engagement with Christianity, but again relates only indirectly to the problematic of language and legality that is supposed to be at the center of this section.

As I already said, the last section, which contains six essays gathered around the title "Justice, Politics and World," will be of most interest to readers of Nancy who look to understand his "politics". The middle essays are examples of Nancy scholarship at its best -- careful reading, critical engagement, clear writing -- the first and last essays of this section, not so much. The first, "Being-in-Common, or the Meaning of Globalization" by Seán Hand, provides cursory summaries of each chapter of The Creation of the World, and considers its relation to earlier texts, such as The Inoperative Community, "The Compearance," and Being Singular Plural, as well as to newer work like "The Confronted Community" and The Truth of Democracy -- all this in less than ten pages -- in order to then show how Nancy appropriated aspects of the divergent visions of globalization presented by Agamben and by Hardt and Negri. Needless to say, some rather important distinctions are completely elided (e.g., the distinction, in The Creation of the World, between becoming-world and world-forming). More importantly, the seemingly neutral presentation of Nancy's theses is dotted with veiled accusations to the effect that Nancy, e.g., merely evokes in the absence of more concrete suggestions (139), unanalytically invokes (140), effects rapid elision (140, 142), makes undetailed use of terms (140), evades the more dogged details (143), etc. Ironically, Hand's reading of Nancy performatively enacts his own criticisms to such a degree that careful readers of Nancy will likely remain unconvinced by his point. These readers should still, however, take Hand's point seriously: that by moving globalization to the ontological register, Nancy abstracts from empirical questions to such a degree that his view of globalization ends up oversimplifying the problem and has no bearing on concrete injustices.

The last essay in this section, by Daniel McDow, though sympathetic to Nancy, demonstrates similar, and in a sense more substantial, flaws. For example, it attempts to demonstrate how being-there is being-with, by drawing a parallel between Nancy and Heidegger's reading of Kant. It remains unclear how it is possible to relate Nancy's being-there to self-consciousness or to the transcendental apperception, even in some sort of attenuated fashion, especially given Nancy's understanding of being as spacing rather than temporalizing and his critical remarks on Heidegger's worldless stone. (If the stone is "there-with" too, then it seems impossible to say that what is at stake is the apprehension of ourselves as being-there as the apprehension of all possible representations (210)). The alignment of authentic being-with with communism and inauthentic being-with with democracy is also puzzling, especially since it is Nancy who has shown how Heidegger's division of "being-with" into the authentic and the inauthentic modalities and his reduction of the "everyday" to the inauthentic mode led him to miss the primordial "with" as such. It is also strange to define democracy as the inauthentic representation of being-in-common, since such a statement assumes the exact metaphysical dichotomies (appearance/reality, beings/ground) that Nancy's work seeks to destabilize and even to overcome. Much is misleading in this essay, not least the addition in square brackets of "Democracy and" before the word "community" in a quotation from The Compearance, which McDow uses to argue that democracy excludes our being-in-common, even though the word "democracy" never appears in that text ("democratic" is used once).

Jane Hiddleston's essay links Nancy's discourse on globalization to postcolonial discourses. While a discussion of Nancy's concept of mêlée (by opposition to mélange) could have served to complicate some of the discussion (e.g., of mondialité as the basis from which to seek to know more about different cultures (154) or as displayed in multilingualism for example (155)), there is much to think about in this article. Todd May's, Oliver Marchart's, and Jason Smith's articles all circle around the question of politics, democracy, and communism. May teases out the differences between Nancy's and Rancière's approaches to justice and politics in terms of preservation versus resistance in a way that is both careful and enlightening. He finds in Nancy, despite his non-foundationalism, an attempt at grounding (even though this grounding is "in nothing") that is absent in Rancière. Marchart, for his part, develops this "grounding in nothing" as a form of post-foundationalism (rather than non-foundationalism). Ultimately, Marchart argues that Nancy's ontology is not political and that what needs to be added to Nancy's singular plural is a thought of relation as essentially asymmetrical (i.e., as a power relation) or of being-with-against. Smith's essay offers a nice contrast to Marchart's. Smith develops the way in which the political, which Nancy understands in his recent works as distinct from the common, has to do not only with resistance to power but with "the exercise of a certain type of power" (187). These three essays complement each other nicely by highlighting some interesting interpretative tensions in Nancy's recent work.

Finally, while there is much to be learned from at least some of the essays in this volume, any reader with an editorial eye will be irritated by the plethora of editorial mistakes, from typos to opening quotation marks that never close, block quotations that are not indented, etc. More importantly, some essays, especially Heikkilä's, would have benefited from careful editing since we are left with many ungrammatical sentences. Here are only two examples: "The question of law arises where the subject or substance, which, given its own foundation, cannot function as a law for Nancy" (48). Or: "Therefore, the interval of being from which every new senses of things of the world, such as a work of art, can emerge" (53). This not only reflects badly on the author, but also on the editor and the publisher.